Adorno and the Political

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Espen Hammer, Adorno and the Political, Routledge, 2005, 224pp, $33.00 (pbk), ISBN 0415289130.

Reviewed by Martin Jay, University of California, Berkeley


One of the now familiar set pieces of Theodor W. Adorno's life was his refusal to cancel a planned lecture on the seemingly arcane subject of "The Classicism of Goethe's Iphigenie" in Berlin in l967, at the height of the student revolution. His apparent fiddling with irrelevant literary criticism while the world was burning around him seemed to many of his critics emblematic of Adorno's "political deficit," his inability to find a link between an intransigently radical theory and anything remotely close to praxis. Although later commentators such as Fredric Jameson grimly concluded that Adorno's failure resulted more from objective conditions than his own personal shortcomings, they concurred with the view that his version of Critical Theory gave little direct political guidance.

In his provocative new book, Espen Hammer sets out to reverse this judgment and show that Adorno, despite all appearances, really had something instructive to say about "the political." This latter term, to be sure, is forced on Hammer by the "Thinking the Political" series in which the book was published, and reflects more the legacy of anti-Marxists like Carl Schmitt, Hannah Arendt, and Leo Strauss than the more dialectical Adorno, who would never have isolated politics from the larger cultural/social totality (however fractured he might agree that totality was in the modern world). Hammer unfortunately never pauses to unpack the baggage that accompanies the term. Employing it does allow him, however, to address seriously the question of Adorno's legacy as a political thinker.

Hammer begins his case by rehearsing the main developments in Adorno's career, which might bear on the question of his political thought. Despite a few inaccuracies -- the worst howler is his confusion of the founding director of the Institut für Sozialforschung Carl Grünberg with the anti-psychoanalytic philosopher Adolf Grünbaum -- he provides a serviceable account of Adorno's vexed and often indirect relationship to the radical movements and parties of his day. He successfully shows that despite Adorno's principled refusal to short-circuit the increasingly attenuated connection between theory and practice, he was a far more "engaged" intellectual, especially after his return from exile to his native Germany, than the legend of his quietist aestheticism would have us believe. Intervening in a number of debates concerning politics, pedagogy and culture, as well as contributing to the German struggle to master its recent past, Adorno remained faithful to a vision of an alternative political order -- indeed, one justifiably called utopian or at least "weakly messianic" -- that would realize the promise of the Enlightenment, whose critique he launched from a position immanent to it (rather than one perilously close to the counter-Enlightenment opposition, as Habermas wrongly concluded).

Adorno's negative dialectics, Hammer argues, produces "an ethics of resistance," which is akin to a "politics of the sublime." That is, it supports a politics that neither papers over contradictions nor forces -- or even pictures in positive terms -- a reconciliation that is not yet achievable. As such, it is what might be called a placeholder politics, looking for ciphers of redemption in cultural forms that have not yet been absorbed entirely into the "administered world" of late capitalist modernity. Refusing to embrace the conservative tradition of Kulturkritik, Adorno resisted the lure of elitist despair, however close he may have seemed to it in practice. Hammer interprets, perhaps too one-sidedly, the politics that Adorno implicitly advocated as anti-Hegelian because of its disdain for totalizing idealism as a handmaiden of totalitarian politics; in such works as Hegel: Three Studies, Adorno gave a far more nuanced reading of the contrary impulses in Hegel himself. But Hammer rightly sees it as a politics that gains its leverage by defying the reduction of experience to the concepts that define it.

To explicate Adorno's meaning, Hammer introduces a category derived from the work of Stanley Cavell, about whom he wrote his first book: "categorical declarative." The term suggests a self-reflective statement in which speakers are able to grasp the implied performative effects of their speech acts. "Following Cavell's definition of a categorical declarative," he writes, "we may think of an Adornian analysis of an existing concept as an attempt to explicate, by citing instances of its use, the performative implications that the concept may have for a specific speaker. The concept is thus confronted with a social reality whose determination turns out to conflict with the concept's own implications. According to Adorno, such a conflict would typically be experienced as suffering." (p. 86).

I am not sure what adding Cavell's terminology really does to flesh out what Adorno meant by "immanent critique," which has long been recognized as his signature analytic tool. And it is a pity that Hammer fails to seize the opportunity to apply it to "the concept of the political" itself, which began its career in a book with precisely that name by Carl Schmitt. Hammer is nonetheless correct in noting that immanent critique in Adorno was always juxtaposed with a more transcendent alternative that found its leverage outside of the world as it currently is. As a result, negative dialectics resisted both historicist relativism and an ahistorical ontological ground as the basis of a politics that overcomes the alienation of modernity by restoring a fully immanent way of life prior to the fall (an ideal Hammer attributes to Heidegger and his progeny). Instead, Adorno's normative standard seems to be an uneasy mixture of Kantian autonomy and the mimesis of the non-subjective object, the memory of which is preserved in our ability to appreciate natural -- that is, not humanly created -- beauty.

In seeking to locate the placeholder of this utopian mixture, Adorno turned, as we know, to "advanced art works," which Hammer claims against Habermas and his faith in communicative interaction, may be a "powerful arena of praxis and political engagement capable in most instances of bringing social conflicts more effectively and adequately into view than any 'rational argumentation.'" (p. 158) Why "in most instances" Hammer does not pause to demonstrate. Once again drawing on Cavell, he compares this stance with what the latter recognized as the "perfectionism" of figures like Thoreau and Emerson, who spurned the status quo in the name of a higher political order in which true freedom would be realized. But does bringing these conflicts into view mean resolving them, as the perfectionist label would suggest? Hammer leaves the question open, as he cites Chantal Mouffe against Habermas to remind us that "a living democratic politics requires the acceptance of heterogeneity, conflict and antagonism." (p. 157).

Although anxious to defend Adorno, Hammer does acknowledge weaknesses in his position, which work to subvert the case he tries to make. Despite his egalitarian impulses and disdain for the hierarchical prejudices of Kulturkritik, Adorno, Hammer concedes, "turns political engagement into something so rarified that only a privileged elite might ever be in a position to partake in it." (p. 166). Placeholder politics, he implies, may never find a way to transfer its redemptive content into a form that will realize it in direct ways. Moreover, Hammer adds, "Adorno's negativism is unhelpful when it comes to analyzing the conscious decision-making processes that must be part of any collective political project. The strategically elitist stress on disruption from culturally privileged standpoints prevents a productive understanding of much of the current activity on the Left, especially the anti-globalization movement whose politics has revived the older Marxist interest in questions of justice and solidarity." (pp. 178-179). Hammer's own political investments come to the fore here, as they do when he chastises Wolfgang Welsch for foreclosing "the possibility of indicating historical tendencies capable of leading to a state of reconciliation" (p. 106), but they remain at a level of yearning for something better that is no more detailed than Adorno's writings in spelling out what that might look like or how to get there. This is clearly more a politics of attitude than of programmatic or procedural substance, an attitude that doesn't get us very far in dealing with the new political landscape of the post-9/11 world, where there is precious little danger of a stifling one-dimensional politics based on the tyranny of a rational consensus.

Ironically, all of those defenders of the agonistic or even antagonistic essence of "the political" against the boring compromises of liberalism with its tepid faith in communicative rationalism may have gotten more than they bargained for. As many commentators have pointed out, a world divided between George W. Bush and Osama bin Laden is not one in which rational argument has much of a chance to persuade anyone. Each one, moreover, has a concept -- democracy or theocracy -- which they see sadly unrealized in the actual world, and which they are prepared to kill lots of other people to achieve. For all its benefits, reading Adorno as a political theorist will not do very much to get us out of the mess that all of us -- and not just the disenchanted Left -- find ourselves in at the present conjuncture of world history.