Adorno: Disenchantment and Ethics

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Bernstein, Jay, Adorno: Disenchantment and Ethics, Cambridge University Press, 2001, 478 pp, $25.00 (pbk), ISBN 0-521-00309-1.

Reviewed by Espen Hammer, University of Essex


Unlike many significant thinkers in the Continental tradition, including Hegel, Nietzsche, and Heidegger, Adorno has never attracted much advanced critical attention in the Anglo-American academy, at least not from philosophers. Whether Adorno’s writing has seemed too forbidding, too difficult, not relevant enough, or simply too obscure is hard to say; the fact, however, remains that the implications of his work, especially for analytical philosophy, have remained virtually unexplored. While Adorno has been read by a small number of philosophers interested in the Frankfurt School of Critical Social Theory, there has been little or no confrontation between his views on epistemology, philosophy of language, or ethics, and those of contemporary Anglo-American practitioners in these fields.

With the publication of Jay Bernstein’s Adorno: Disenchantment and Ethics, this situation is bound to change. For the first time since Adorno’s untimely death in 1969, we have a study that not only draws on a wide range of current positions, but which situates Adorno right in the middle of contemporary philosophical debate in ethics. To be sure, Adorno’s arguments may not convince many analytic philosophers, but at least Bernstein shows that Adorno’s account deserves to be taken seriously, and that is no small feat.

As Bernstein intimates, Adorno can be read as a companion to Recovering Ethical Life: Jürgen Habermas and the Future of Critical Theory, his 1994 critical study of Habermas’s theory of communicative action and discourse ethics. However, while the title’s reference to “the future of Critical Theory” was then meant to invoke Bernstein’s recommendation of Adorno over Habermas, it never became entirely clear in that earlier book that Adorno really could be credited with anything like an ethical theory, at least not one that could compete with Habermas’s elaborate effort to ground a discourse ethics. Indeed, as most readers of Adorno have noted, it is far from obvious that Adorno really defends a position in moral philosophy at all. Looking at Negative Dialectics and Problems of Moral Philosophy, the two works that seem most evidently to address issues in ethics, we find meta-criticism [Metakritik] – efforts, basically, to view philosophical theory within the terms set for it by the social and historical circumstances of its formulation – but very little theory in the positive or traditional sense of the word.

Acknowledging “that Adorno did not produce a work of moral philosophy” (p. 2), Bernstein extrapolates and constructs more than he re-constructs. By approaching Adorno from different angles, drawing on a wide range of arguments from sociology and analytical philosophy, he offers a sophisticated and compelling account of the normative presuppositions and ideals that implicitly govern Adorno’s writing. While this has produced an extremely long (478 pages) and at times slightly repetitive text, it has the advantage of “testing” Adorno’s thinking in confrontation with some of the most advanced contributions to ethics in recent years.

Following an elaborate introduction, the book is divided into nine chapters. Bernstein starts by making a strong link between ethics and the problems of modernity as they are understood by Marx, Weber, and Nietzsche. Essentially, the claim is that the process of “rationalization” – “the domination of scientific rationality in intellectual life and … the bureaucratic rationalization of practical life in the context of indefinite economic (capital) expansion” (p. 3) - has led to a radical disenchantment such that the world and the people in it are stripped of their power to (rationally) motivate and guide our practical orientation. Drawing on Dieter Henrich’s essay, “The Concept of Moral Insight and Kant’s Doctrine of the Fact of Reason,”1 Bernstein argues that the morally good can determine action only if it demands and receives approval. The problem with “rationalized reason” is that by progressively replacing our experience of others as unique and vulnerable individuals with an impersonal, “externalist” appeal to laws and putatively universal norms, it drives this demand out. In its most extreme form, this process, Bernstein argues in the penultimate chapter, can be seen to have created the conditions under which Auschwitz and similar horrors of late modernity were made possible.

For Bernstein, following Adorno’s reflections on what he in Minima Moralia calls “the damaged life,” examples of genuine ethical responsiveness must be sought for in the repressed margins of society – particularly in the private sphere. Ideally, this responsiveness would be supported by structures of material inference that agents master in virtue of knowing a language. However, the thick concepts that once made a substantial ethical life possible, and to which communitarians such as Alasdair MacIntyre appeal, “are no longer sufficiently available” (p. 63). At the end of a history of rationalization, a gap has arisen between what may count for us as reasons that are rationally acceptable and structures of motivation. The task of philosophy, according to Bernstein’s Adorno, is therefore to reconstruct the dependency of the self-identical item – the concept, rationality, the constitutive subject, the universal – on its non-identical other. Philosophy must bring nature back in by criticizing the false separation of predicative identification and non-predicative identification.

There is much to be said for this vision, and Bernstein does an excellent job in bringing out the various ways in which Adorno can be said to defend it. His claim that much of modern moral philosophy, including prominent strands of neo-Kantianism, discourse ethics, and various forms of consequentialism, suffers from a motivational deficit, an inability to indicate how and why agents in a given situation should be motivated to act morally, seems to me overwhelmingly plausible. I also think he is right to read Adorno as a thinker who was intensely aware of this problem, and hence right in defending Adorno’s relevance in this intellectual context. However, I also find that the book leaves several important questions unanswered.

One line of argument that could be called into question is Bernstein’s contention that the good, generating the ethical demand, always comes down on the side of the non-identical, or what he refers to as “sensuous particularity.” His favoured example is the body in pain which, he maintains, calls for our compassion and healing, where “compassion immediately figures the integrity of the body, its freedom from pain and suffering, as of value” (p. 406). In Bernstein’s view, the desire for such response needs no justification; it is part of our animal nature, and it finds expression in material inferences from awarenesses of a state of affairs, “from (the appreciation of) bleeding badly to (the response) I will apply a tourniquet” (p. 322). However, the danger - which Adorno would probably have pointed out - of appealing to anthropological characteristics is that it begs the question of why aggressive and destructive responses to the other do not count as equally object-oriented and object-involving. Why isn’t lashing out at someone in a situation of everyday and limited conflict a perfectly good example of allowing sensuous immediacy to matter? Not only does he underestimate the significance of human aggression and destructiveness, but by feeding himself on a one-sided diet of examples, Bernstein falsely believes that sensuous immediacy itself is possessive of intrinsic normative force: “Because living nature is suppressed in the emergence of rationalized modernity we experience it as damaging, as hurting” (p. 37). However, it can only possess such force in conjunction with a disposition on the part of agents to respond ethically to it, and this disposition may not always be aligned to the good.

At times, though, Bernstein seems happy to concede this point. However, his way of doing so is to want to “resurrect a legitimate anthropomorphism” (p. 196) – of bringing what he calls “the living nature” into view. The living nature, which allows us to see middle-sized objects in the environment as bearers of significance (as living, hurt, needy), is, while not projected onto the world in the obviously subjective manner in which perceiving a tree as inhabited by a god is, “bound to our contingent and historically conditioned practices” (p. 191); hence it is, at least partly, dependent on our actual material inferences. My worry here is that the concession to some weak form of “animism” or projection seems to invite a skeptical reply: indeed, it may even be viewed as rehearsing the claims made by the non-cognitivist moral skeptic. A Levinasian position, in which the other, the source of the ethical demand, is taken to be entirely beyond the questionable and empirically unstable domain of material inference, may be seen as responding to this problem.

A final hesitation about this hugely stimulating book concerns the nature of modernity itself. At times it seems as if Bernstein wants to imply that pre-modern social arrangements, while often bad and repressive in themselves, left the right moral ideals and source of ethical authority intact; and that in doing so, they radically distinguish themselves from modern social arrangements, which seem to have left us in a state of moral nihilism. The apparent nostalgia for the pre-modern makes itself particularly felt in his defense of what Max Weber calls charismatic authority, which typically effects conversions and non-reflective acceptance among its followers. It is hard not to detect a latent conservatism in this book, a conservatism which may or may not be found in Adorno’s work but which certainly makes it difficult to espouse any robust ethical position in contemporary society.

On the other hand, Bernstein thinks of the true realization of modernity (as opposed to the bad and existing modernity of abstraction and instrumental reason), and hence of an ethical life worth having, in terms of a promise. Does he thereby mean an infinite deferral of some sort? If so, then this seems to suggest that Bernstein’s Adorno demands too much, and that by doing so he may end up throwing the child out with the bath-water. However, if activating material inferences helps us to conduct a remembrance along Wittgensteinian lines, of what we say when and its implications, then Bernstein’s project may turn out to have a genuine practical import.


1. See Dieter Henrich, The Unity of Reason: Essays on Kant’s Philosophy (London: Harvard University Press, 1994), pp. 55-87