Adorno's Positive Dialectic

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Sherratt, Yvonne, Adorno's Positive Dialectic, Cambridge University Press, 2002, 264pp, $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 052181393X.

Reviewed by Deborah Cook, University of Windsor


In The Coast of Utopia, Alexander Herzen muses aloud about the course of human history. Asking, “Where is the unity, the meaning, of nature’s highest creation?” Herzen offers this oracular response: “Surely those millions of little streams of accident and wilfulness have their correction in the vast underground river which, without a doubt, is carrying us to the place where we’re expected! But there is no such place, that’s why it’s called utopia.”1 Tom Stoppard’s evocation of the millenarian Zeitgeist in his remarkable trilogy finds an enigmatic echo in Yvonne Sherratt’s attempt to unearth a positive thesis in Adorno’s forbiddingly negative critical theory. According to Sherratt, Adorno does sight the coast of utopia. Yet his utopia is neither situated in any place nor realizable at any point in time. Indeed, Sherratt argues that Adorno’s critical theory is teleological precisely because he believes that the subterranean flow of history courses towards an aim that is simultaneously “unrealised and unrealisable.” This new Erewhon is enlightenment (44), or “the ‘good’ society governed by genuine reason” (19).

Sherratt wants to challenge existing interpretations of Adorno as an unrepentant pessimist with her thesis that Adorno offers a positive notion of enlightenment as the inherently unrealisable telos of human history. She focuses on Dialectic of Enlightenment, Minima Moralia, Negative Dialectics, and Aesthetic Theory to support her contention that Adorno outlines a “systematic Utopian thesis” (13) based on a largely Freudian conception of the human soul or human nature. Adorno’s utopianism “consists of incorporating aesthetic experience into all the foundational dimensions of human life, including reason itself” (17). Acknowledging the centrality of Marx in Adorno’s thought (35-8), Sherratt nonetheless wants to counter what she perceives as a widespread bias “towards an examination of the Marxist influence” (14) by highlighting Adorno’s debt to Freud and his psychoanalytic concepts of “the ego and id, maturity and immaturity” (68-9). That Adorno sketches a positive dialectical relationship between id and ego instincts is one of Sherratt’s central theses, though she readily concedes that her interpretation builds upon “thoughts that Adorno alludes to but has not himself systematically developed” (146).

Id and ego instincts can only relate to one other dialectically if each offers its own unique cognitive purchase on objects. Consequently, as she develops her view that Adorno has a dialectical conception of this relationship, Sherratt contests Freud’s claim that the id instincts are solely “responsible for the (absolutely non-cognitive) pleasurable engagement of the Subject with the Object.” To demonstrate that Adorno believes the id instincts are geared towards the acquisition of knowledge, Sherratt cites a passage from Minima Moralia where Adorno criticizes Freud for turning reason into “‘a mere superstructure’.” Against this conception of reason as epiphenomenal, Sherratt contends not only that Adorno grounds reason in the id instincts but also that the relationship between the id and its objects has the same features as aesthetic knowledge acquisition. She concludes from this discussion that the id instincts are oriented towards knowledge acquisition (210-11).

Unfortunately, this argument is problematic on logical grounds. For one cannot infer directly from either (or both) of these claims that the id instincts themselves are cognitively oriented. The argument is flawed on the hermeneutic level as well because Adorno actually grounds reason in the ego instinct of self-preservation. Dialectic of Enlightenment–a central text for Sherratt–advances the speculative anthropological claim that Western rationality first emerged in response to threats posed by external nature. Reason originally developed as an organ of adaptation to an environment perceived as hostile. Adorno stresses the relationship between reason and self-preservation in his later work as well: “Ratio came into being in the first place as an instrument of self-preservation, that of reality-testing.”2 But he also warns that the more uninhibitedly reason “turns itself into the absolute opposite of nature and forgets nature in itself, all the more will a self-preservation gone wild regress into nature.”3 In fact, it is just this regression of self-preservation that accounts for the negative aspects of enlightenment; self-preservation has “gone wild” because it now unleashes destructive tendencies that threaten the lives of the very subjects it is meant to preserve.

Sherratt follows her controversial claim about the dialectical relationship between the id and ego instincts with the argument that aesthetic knowledge acquisition “has its basis in the aspect of the self that is the id instincts” (211), while instrumental knowledge is grounded in the ego instincts. Adorno outlines a positive dialectical thesis because instrumental and aesthetic reason are related to each other in such a way that they may supplement each other, thereby giving rise to a more flexible mode of cognition which lends a voice to objects in their concrete, material haecceity rather than merely subsuming them coercively under concepts or conceptual systems in the identificatory fashion that Adorno condemns throughout his work. As an antidote to rigid identificatory thought–which, as Sherratt persuasively argues, constantly risks a decline into animism–Adorno offers this new dialectical mode of thought that “retains precision, clarity, and distinctness and negates rigidity” (138-9).

Sharrett’s claim about the dialectical relationship between instrumental and aesthetic knowledge acquisition is largely based on an interpretation of one sentence in Negative Dialectics: “art and philosophy … both keep faith with their own substance through their opposites.” In a series of elisions, Sherratt equates philosophy with instrumental reason, which she then interprets as the opposite of art, thereby attempting to ground her view that instrumental reason can be played off dialectically against aesthetic reason (190). What is most problematic here is Sherratt’s conflation of philosophy with instrumental reason. In the sentence she quotes, Adorno actually contrasts his own non-instrumental philosophy, or critical theory, with art. Moreover, he does not maintain that there is a dialectical relationship between philosophy and art such that art can supplement philosophy in the way Sherratt claims. If philosophy “will not abandon the yearning that animates the nonconceptual side of art,” it must remain faithful to its own conceptual substance. Even though the concept “negates that yearning,” philosophy can neither circumvent this negation, nor submit to it. Rather, it “must strive, by way of the concept, to transcend the concept” (ND, 15).

In Adorno: Disenchantment and Ethics, also published recently by Cambridge University Press, J. M. Bernstein makes a sophisticated attempt to explain what Adorno means by striving to transcend concepts by way of concepts. Unfortunately, Sherratt makes no reference to this book in developing her thesis about Adorno’s positive dialectic. At the very least, she might have heeded the emphasis he places on the ethical dimension of Adorno’s thought, along with his warning that “to displace reason with aesthetic praxis and judgement” constitutes a “massive misunderstanding and distortion”4 of Adorno’s work. Sherratt wants to supplement instrumental identity thinking with an aesthetic mode of identification owing to the failure of non-identity thinking to serve as an adequate corrective to identity thinking. While convincingly documenting this failure in Chapter Four, Sherratt could have overcome it by developing Gillian Rose’s claim that Adorno postulates a rational mode of identity thinking. To cite Rose, rational identity thinking involves the use of concepts to refer to the ideal conditions of an object’s existence. Rose calls this “the utopian aspect of identifying.” She adds: “For the concept to identify its object in this sense the particular object would have to have all the properties of its ideal state.”5

Both Rose and Bernstein have convincingly argued that the salient feature of Adorno’s thought is its ethical dimension. Indeed, one of the central problems that awaits an interpretive solution in Adorno scholarship is the relationship between the epistemological, ethical, and aesthetic dimensions of his thought. More to the point, when Sherratt claims that the nonconceptual, absorptive identification that characterizes aesthetic reason “allows us to be receptive to the fact that the object has a sense of self” (180), she supplements instrumental thinking with the aesthetic loss of self in the “selfhood” of objects such that “the Subject himself … is incorporated into the Object.” Aesthetic identification consists in “the Subject becoming like the Object” (173). Yet such absorption would not only involve a highly contentious identification with the very objects that Adorno describes throughout his work as fundamentally damaged; it would also not permit the subject to recognize this damage as damage. To identify uncritically with damaged life certainly does not bode well, even for an inherently unrealizable utopia. In fact, Adorno characterizes his dialectical mode of thought as an ethical endeavour that attempts both to make good on the damage inflicted on objects under existing conditions (ND, 19) and to transcend concepts by using concepts.

Adorno also states that “the means employed in negative dialectics for the penetration of its hardened [verhärteten] objects is possibility–the possibility of which reality has cheated the objects and which is nonetheless visible in each one” (ND, 52). Indeed, he explicitly defines utopia as the “consciousness of possibility that sticks to the concrete, the undisfigured” (ND, 56-7). The positive, utopian dimension of his thought consists in its conceptual invocation of the emphatic possibilities that glimmer faintly in damaged reality. These utopian possibilities are by no means exhausted in a dialectical conception of subjectivity, as Sherratt implies when she focuses exclusively on the subjective, psychological, and Freudian dimension of Adorno’s theory to the exclusion of its predominantly Marxist thrust. The utopian goal of critical thought is “to abolish the hierarchy,” not only between the thinking subject and its objects, the ego and the id, but also between society and the individual (ND, 181). If enlightened and mature subjects constitute an enlightened society, it is equally the case that “the subject of ratio pursuing its self-preservation is itself an actual universal, society–in its full logic, humanity.”6

This utopian vision obviously remains unrealized today. Is it, however, unrealizable in the sense that history is carrying us to a place that does not exist and never will exist? Are we really going straight to nowhere? Martin Jay convincingly demonstrates that Adorno’s is not a straightforwardly teleological view of history.7 Indeed, Sherratt simply contradicts herself when she argues that Adorno has a teleological conception of history that is simultaneously “non-developmental” and “has no end point” (67). Expressing profound doubt on countless occasions about prospects for realizing the emphatic goal of an enlightened society, Adorno never conceived of this goal as the telos of history. Rather, he famously postulated a line of historical development that leads from “the slingshot to the megaton bomb.” To the extent that history exhibits a pattern, it is one of universal social regression–not one that leads from “savagery to humanitarianism”(ND, 320). In Negative Dialectics, then, Adorno not only rejects the idea that history follows a subterranean course towards enlightenment, he sometimes seems to adopt a dystopian conception of history. Although there are moments when he also suggests that history could take a dramatic turn for the better, Adorno often appears to bequeath to his readers the same dark legacy that Herzen bestows upon his son: “The coming revolution is the only religion I pass on to you, and it’s a religion without a paradise on the other shore. But do not remain on this shore. Better to perish.”8


1. Tom Stoppard, The Coast of Utopia, Part II, (London: Faber and Faber, 2002) p. 100.

2. Theodor W. Adorno, “Marginalia to Theory and Praxis,” Critical Models: Interventions and Catchwords, trans. Henry W. Pickford, (New York: Columbia University Press, 1998) p.272.

3. Idem, Negative Dialectics, trans. E. B. Ashton, (New York: Continuum, 1973) p. 289;translation altered. Cited henceforth as ND.

4. J. M. Bernstein, Adorno: Disenchantment and Ethics (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2001) p. 4.

5. Gillian Rose, The Melancholy Science: An Introduction to the Thought of Theodor W. Adorno (New York: Columbia University Press, 1978) p. 44.

6. Adorno, “Marginalia to Theory and Praxis,” Critical Models, op. cit., p. 272.

7. See Martin Jay, Adorno (London: Fontana Paperbacks, 1984) pp. 107-8. See also Simon Jarvis, Adorno: A Critical Introduction (New York: Routledge, 1998) p. 37.

8. Tom Stoppard, The Coast of Utopia, Part III, (London: Faber and Faber, 2002) p. 34.