Adorno's Modernism: Art, Experience, and Catastrophe

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Espen Hammer, Adorno's Modernism: Art, Experience, and Catastrophe, Cambridge University Press, 2015, 228pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781107121591.

Reviewed by Owen Hulatt, University of York


Adorno's Aesthetic Theory was published posthumously in 1969. Though incomplete, it nonetheless represented a culmination of a life-time's engagement with modernism. From the young Adorno's study with Alban Berg, to his critical reception of Jazz published in 1936 under the pseudonym 'Hektor Rottweiler', through to the scorn he poured on Stravinsky in Philosophy of the New Music in 1947, and finally in the culiminating posthumous work Aesthetic Theory itself, Adorno was a passionate, yet in many and important ways non-dogmatic[1], advocate of the power and necessity of artistic modernism.

F. R. Leavis, in 1932's New Bearings in English Poetry, recognized modernism -- in particular that of the poets T.S. Eliot, Ezra Pound and Gerard Manley Hopkins -- as representing a needed break with nineteenth century artistic tradition. For purely aesthetic reasons, modernism -- or something like it -- seemed to be necessary. But, more than this, in Leavis' view modernism was also a reflection of the fragmentation of contemporary culture. And, in Leavis' view, this reflection was salutary -- in giving much needed expression to these pathologies of modern life -- and yet also deeply damaging to the public role of art. The cultural fragmentation that modernism reflected was over-determined, intricate and difficult to grasp. As a consequence, the artistic expression and reflection of that fragmentation inherited this complexity and its steep cognitive demands. Accordingly, modernism simultaneously gained the power to evoke and diagnose cultural problems and lost the ability to be comprehensible to anyone but the members of a small elite.

In Adorno's account of modernism, we likewise find these two features again -- the claim of modernism's diagnostic function through its formal innovation and fragmentation, and similarly its refusal of easy accessibility. However, for Adorno the stakes are far higher. Not only is modernism a reflection of specific features of our cultural life, it is a reflection of important developments in the history of rationality, a history which has progressively deepened the antagonism between conceptual reason and human flourishing. This history of reason, with its internal aporiae and tendency towards inhumanity had, in Adorno's view, found its latest and most repellent expression in the Holocaust. For Adorno, art is obliged to reflect these horrors, to criticize their enabling conditions, and perhaps even to vouchsafe momentary impressions of a better form of reason, and of society.

Accordingly, for Adorno his theory of modernism is not only an aesthetic theory, but also a theory of reason, history, and the history of reason. In order to understand his account of modernism, then, we need a firm grasp on his philosophy more generally -- and this demands forays into Adorno's epistemology and sociology, his critical relationship to Kant and post-Kantianism (through which that epistemology was often developed), and his metaphysics. We also need a keen understanding of just what role historical suffering -- the Catastrophe of Espen Hammer's title -- plays in his theory of the aesthetic.

On the other hand, the very fact of this deep interrelation between Adorno's theory of art, his theory of history, and his theory of modernism raises the question of how, if it all, Adorno's aesthetic theory can today survive. Artistic modernism as a practice, after all, was in decline even during the writing of Aesthetic Theory. As Hammer notes, Adorno's silence on the non-traditional art forms that already were gaining traction (land-art, for example) is remarkable. So, the conditions of the comprehensibility of Adorno's aesthetic theory are broad and deep; and these self-same conditions, by virtue of being tied into theories of history, culture and rationality, also raise the problem of whether Adorno's theory of art has been outstripped by the passing of time.

Compounding these issues is the infamous, and intentional, amphiboly found in the title of Adorno's work -- Aesthetic Theory. For Adorno, an account of art must perforce move through a number of explanatory registers and domains, none of which should be given absolute priority. As the work is jointly informed by philosophical, historical, and technological concerns (amongst others) the structure of our account of art should not be seen to lend any one of these registers or domains greater weight than any other. And so Adorno's theory cannot be given a straightforward deductive structure; and nor is there a clear place to begin in expounding it.

All of this is to set quite a barrier to entry for anyone who wishes to explicate, or critically extend, Adorno's work. Hammer's approach is astute. Adorno's Modernism is divided into thematically distinct chapters. Each of these thematic chapters -- on natural beauty, for example (Chapter 2), or aesthetic autonomy (Chapter 3) -- is composed of a series of narrative curlicues, which intersect the body of Adorno's thought at varying points, and traverse the various registers (epistemological, sociological, ethical, aesthetic) and important strands in Adorno's thought which gather together around each theme. The clear strength of this approach is that the nature of Adorno's account -- which, by design, must be kept clear of being reduced to any one of its aspects -- is communicated to the reader. It also allows the interrelation between such apparently distinct philosophical concerns as art and self-determination, for example (as pursued in Chapter 1) to emerge organically in the course of discussion, and thereby to present and, go some way towards justifying, the movements between explanatory domains which Adorno so strongly argued were a necessary feature of the philosophical investigation of art.

A reliable carding point in Hammer's careful pluralist elaboration of the enabling conditions of Adorno's account is Kant, more specifically the aporiae introduced by the Third Critique, and the multifarious responses to these aporiae found in the post-Kantian tradition. Hammer is a past master on this material, and hence it is no surprise that this book finds him situating Adorno excellently, with no end of clarity, in relation to Kant, Fichte, Hegel, and related figures. But what is especially distinctive is Hammer's ability to balance this kind of discussion (familiar from recent works on Adorno like Brian O'Connor's Adorno and Martin Shuster's Autonomy After Auschwitz) with an eye for some of the less obvious contributors and connections to Adorno's view. Particularly welcome is Hammer's astute mention of the influence of the French Surrealist Roger Caillois on Adorno's account of mimesis, for example, which is rarely reflected in the extant literature. Similarly -- as a further example -- Adorno's criticism of Kant's account of aesthetic disinterest is developed in such a way as to clarify the thought of both figures, leading into a discussion of the contribution which consideration of Alexander Nehamas' account of disinterest can offer in this connection, and finally to consideration of how all of this might clarify Adorno's cryptic notion of the non-identical. These deeper elaborations of Adorno's relationship to his philosophical peers, and extensions of Adorno's own thought into contemporary debates, appear frequently and naturally in the course of Hammer's explication of the structure of Adorno's approach. This entails that Adorno's Modernism elaborates an appreciable narrative of Adorno's work which is accessible to newcomers, and also frequently broaches novel and underappreciated matters of exegesis and argument of use to specialists.

It should be emphasized that the erudition and far reaching nature of Hammer's account serve to convincingly establish, in perhaps the most forceful way yet, Adorno's place in the ongoing study not only of post-Kantianism, but philosophy more generally. Hammer's ability to situate and argue for Adorno's position in relation to epistemology, aesthetics and ethics more generally can be seen -- alongside more recent works in this vein like Fabian Freyenhagen's Living Less Wrongly and Shuster's Autonomy After Auschwitz -- as part of the growing argument for Adorno's relevance outside of Critical Theory simpliciter. And Hammer deepens and broadens the discussion to be had in this connection through his ability to continually supplement his account of Adorno's aesthetic theory with important and suggestive remarks on this score.

Many of these remarks are obliged to remain remarks, however. The continuous movement which allows for the breadth of Hammer's account entails that Hammer's gestures towards the stance he takes on matters of interpretive disagreement, and the deeper difficulties which lurk in some of Adorno's more robust claims about history, reason, and instrumental reason, cannot always find space for more detailed development. On the one hand, this recommends this book as an elegant and important means of familiarizing the reader with an argumentatively and exegetically strong position that is entirely contemporary with the latest research on Adorno. On the other, it means that many of the most troubling problems of the Adornian position -- frequently acutely pinpointed and remarked upon by Hammer -- persist. In a fashion again reminiscent of Freyenhagen's Living Less Wrongly, Adorno's reliance on a highly specific and troubling account of social structuration, and social control of reason and autonomy, is here made entirely evident, and shown to be an irremovable part of the functioning of his position. As Adorno receives increased attention and, for want of a better term, academic respectability, a proper test of the sustainability of Adorno's ambitious genealogy of reason -- with its grounding in the not obviously secure work of Mauss, Hubert, Caillois and Frazer -- and his sociology -- with its not obviously accurate claims about capitalism's monolithic nature; the Holocaust as a product of 'instrumental reason'; and the spontaneity of the individual as almost entirely nugatory -- looms ever larger as necessary, and its deferment in the wider literature becomes increasingly visible.

[1] His fulsome praise of Schoenberg's use of free atonality, for example, did not prevent his criticism of Schoenberg's later use of dodecaphonic composition.