Advances in Experimental Moral Psychology

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Hagop Sarkissian and Jennifer Cole Wright (eds.), Advances in Experimental Moral Psychology, Bloomsbury, 2014, 256pp., $112.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781472509383.

Reviewed by Jesse S. Summers, Duke University


The distinction between moral psychology and moral philosophy has never been a clear one. Observations about what humans are like plays an indispensable role in understanding our moral obligations and virtues, and great swaths of moral philosophy until the 19th century are psychology avant la lettre, empirical speculations about how we form moral judgments, about mental faculties and rationality, pleasure, pain, and character. This relationship between philosophy and psychology becomes both opaque and strained once experimental psychology develops its own academic discipline. Nevertheless, many contemporary moral debates -- like those surrounding moral character and moral motivation -- are clearly aware of and are sometimes in response to findings of empirical psychology. Experimental psychology is again leaching into the philosophical water.

It is a credit to Hagop Sarkissian and Jennifer Cole Wright that the research they assembled adds further nutrients to the soil. This collection is not a survey of empirical moral psychology. It instead pushes into debates whose philosophical implications have yet to be widely considered. As a result, the collection's primary audience is anyone already interested in moral psychology understood broadly, and it will need no further recommendation to those with empirical interests in the topic.

However, there remain good questions about just what experimental psychology has to offer moral philosophy. Enlightenment-era folk psychology still furnishes our moral debates with most of their psychological language and concepts -- e.g., reasons, intuitions -- so experimental psychology, insofar as its language and concepts have changed, often does not fit neatly into philosophical debates. Indeed, this collection may further reinforce the belief that empirical psychology is, at best, only on the topic of morality, but that its findings are not relevant to any genuinely philosophical debate about morality. I'll return to this point below.

Regardless, if the collection does no more than preach to the empirically-minded choir, it provides a rousing sermon nonetheless. It has three sections, on moral persons, moral grounding, and measuring morality. I'll entirely ignore the merits of the chapters as good experimental psychology, but will otherwise summarize each chapter and briefly assess a couple of the arguments. I'll end by considering how the collection as a whole makes the case for the philosophical relevance of experimental psychology. This is not an argumentative burden the editors take on themselves, but they do have something to say.

The first section, on moral persons, begins with an article by Piercarlo Valdesolo. The empirical evidence, he argues, shows that we evaluate people for their moral qualities in a biased way, favoring how "warm" the person is and ignoring how "competent" the person is, though both warmth and competence are necessary to the execution of moral actions. Jeremy A. Frimer and Harrison Oakes use a similar distinction and conclude, using a different methodology, that we use warmth as a proxy for moral assessment. We take expressions of competence, by contrast, as selfish -- except, interestingly, in the case of moral exemplars. Such exemplars (Martin Luther King, Jr., Nelson Mandela, Gandhi) explicitly linked, in their public pronouncements, the exercise of competence and warmth; those who are not thought to be moral exemplars (Donald Rumsfeld, Adolf Hitler) only conveyed competence.

Diving even deeper into this distinction, Gabriela Pavarini and Simone Schnall demonstrate that witnessing morally good deeds can be inspiring when those deeds demonstrate warmth, but threatening when they demonstrate competence. This negative reaction, which occurs particularly when the observed virtuous behavior could be a threat to one's own reputation or relative moral standing, leads people to disparage and diminish the deed, to describe it as a selfish act instead of a moral one.

The final two chapters of the section, the first by Mark Alfano, and the second by Joshua Rust and Eric Schwitzgebel, consider some of those things that we think would make a person good, or at least better. Rust and Schwitzgebel summarize a number of their own studies showing that moral philosophers are not, by behavioral evaluations, any more moral than those who do not spend their time studying morality -- with very small exceptions. They suggest five ways to make sense of these data, but decline to argue for one model over another.

Alfano similarly responds to psychological studies that, for decades, have accumulated evidence that (apparently) morally irrelevant features of our environments, large and small, can change a person's moral behavior, sometimes dramatically. Alfano presents a theory of virtue that, in response, suggests that the bearers of virtue are best understood as agents and their social milieu and many asocial factors of the sort that were thought to challenge the traditional view of virtue. Taken together, these two chapters emphasize that goodness may not emerge from philosophical reflection, and, indeed, may be located in elements that we normally do not associate with morality at all.

The second section covers moral groundings. Yoel Inbar and David Pizarro open with evidence that moral judgments amplify and are amplified by our disgust reactions. They speculate, given disgust's other current functions, that our disgust sensitivity may have functioned evolutionarily to distance us from threats, e.g., from pathogens. Disgust may have served a similarly advantageous function when it became part of our more sophisticated moral reactions. Daniel Kelly's following chapter more directly assesses what it may mean that disgust reactions, which are prone to false positives, lead us to find moral violations where there are none.

Kelly, like Inbar and Pizarro, speculates on disgust's evolutionary history. He finds the evolutionary history of disgust gives us reason to doubt its reliability for moral judgments. But he also suggests that evolutionary history itself, and the fact that a psychological mechanism did not evolve to track moral truth, does not itself debunk any particular mechanism. The particulars of the mechanism and its evolutionary story must be considered.

This response is useful in understanding what is really behind Kelly's concerns, as well as Inbar and Pizarro's, none of whom cite evolutionary evidence beyond what we can determine by looking at disgust's current functions. But the actual evolutionary history is a red herring, as Kelly's response highlights: all psychological mechanisms have an evolutionary history, and a mechanism may have arisen for reasons quite far from its current function. The real threat to morality is that some of our psychological mechanisms are sensitive to features of our world that are not morally relevant, or are less relevant than our psychology indicates. Disgust is like this. Evolution may have shaped some mechanisms, like disgust, in ways that are now especially morally deceptive, but the moral concern is its current reliability, not how it evolved to be that way. Kelly's conclusion that we should look at the particulars of each mechanism respects this subtlety, and Inbar and Pizarro can account for it, even if all three of these authors speculate on evolutionary history.

The final four articles of the section discuss moral objectivity. Linda J. Skitka considers moral attitudes, specifically those that are authoritative, resistant to one's (other) desires, tied to emotions, yet seen as tracking features of the world. Interestingly, the strength of such apparently moral convictions positively correlates with an intolerance of others' attitudes and even an unwillingness to engage with those who disagree. James R. Beebe finds that we are more likely to think moral issues are objective when there is consensus around the issue, when the issues are considered in concrete examples, and when the relevant issue is a prohibition rather than a positive obligation. Kevin Uttich, George Tsai, and Tania Lombrozo demonstrate that a belief in moral objectivity is correlated with a belief in moral progress and a belief that good people are rewarded and bad people are punished. Finally, Katinka J.P. Quintelier, Delphine De Smet, and Daniel M. T. Fessler raise a distinction under-appreciated in discussions of moral objectivity, specifically in discussions of moral relativism. Moral appraisers of an action may morally disagree with each other, but they may also morally disagree with the agents who performed the action. It turns out that our determination of the action's wrongfulness and of the objectivity of that wrongfulness judgment are both influenced by the agent's assessment of her own action.

The third section is on measuring morality and consists of just one article. Peter Meindl and Jesse Graham reflect on a methodological problem that psychologists are likely to have in assessing moral attitudes. If the researchers want to learn anything about morality, they have to decide which topics to ask about. But that means that the researchers have to decide in advance which questions are morally relevant to the study's participants, and how they will morally interpret the questions. Participants, however, may vary in the moral weight and valence they assign to the issues raised in the research questions, differing both from each other and from the researchers. For example, Meindl and Graham found that participants varied dramatically in how good they thought it would be to talk to xenophobic inmates about the virtues of immigration, with one standard deviation of the responses ranging from extremely morally good to almost neutral. Participants also disagreed with researchers. For example, participants found both cooperating and defecting in a prisoner's dilemma to be morally neutral, whereas they found a psychologist's lying about whether a participant's answers will be anonymous to be extremely immoral. This is certainly not how researchers have shown that they would morally rate those same questions. Researchers are therefore limited in what they can conclude about morality in general from studies using questions about particular moral issues. Meindl and Graham propose in response that studies independently assess, and not just assume, what their participants will likely take as moral.

This last article, although most directly concerned with issues of methodology and construct validity, also suggests a response to the question that I earlier asked: why are the empirical findings in this collection relevant to moral philosophers? The collection repeatedly suggests that people strongly misunderstand how to assess morally persons, traits, judgments, etc. People care too much about warmth, not enough about competence, can't tell reliably what makes a person virtuous, and put too much stock in philosophical reflection as a way to make people better. They trust their disgust reactions to tell them what is immoral, and fail adequately to distinguish their various beliefs about moral objectivity, including, for example, distinguishing beliefs about objectivity from beliefs about whether bad people will be punished. The collection is a litany of the mistakes, distortions, and misunderstandings of those who have not spent enough time quietly reflecting on moral issues and the nature of morality itself (including, perhaps, many moral philosophers themselves, given Rust and Schwitzgebel's findings). Isn't this just evidence that moral philosophy should be done in the armchair, free from hoi polloi and their misguided moral thoughts?

The answer, suggested strongly by the final article and by others throughout the collection, is that our moral judgments are themselves "situated," to borrow a phrase from anthropologists. We are unable to prescind entirely from our own moral judgments and beliefs when we assess the abstract nature and structure of moral judgment and belief -- even if we never leave the armchair. We can easily think of past examples of moral situatedness: Kant's moralistic concerns with masturbation and homosexuality, Aristotle's views of slaves and women, and millennia of condescension towards the culture and philosophical thought of "barbarians" and "savages." These examples are not just curious insights into the milieu of their writers. They are reminders that philosophers' own specific moral judgments influence their theoretical views. Just as we may not notice our own accent except by noticing how differently others speak, we may not notice the factors that influence our own moral judgments except by noting what influences others' judgments; or, by testing to see what influences others' judgments.

The editors, to reiterate, do not take as their primary goal the defense of experimental work as important to moral psychology. This is not a collection designed to convince anyone to care about empirical moral psychology. Its value is primarily as an advance within empirical moral psychology, introducing relatively new and fecund topics into philosophical discourse. It does this well. For example, the research on the various kinds of objective moral attitudes could lead us to rethink what kind of attitude counts as moral. The systematic conflation of disgust and moral judgment surveyed by Inbar, Pizarro, and Kelly may reveal something misleading in our psychology, or maybe instead that morality extends to issues we thought were not moral. Empirical findings alone won't tell us what is a mistake. As Rust and Schwitzgebel end their article: "We recommend the issues for further empirical study and for further armchair reflection" (106). Both are needed. What Kelly says about debunking arguments in general should be said about many of these experimental findings: the specifics matter, but not in a way that we can productively generalize about in advance. The philosophical implications of the findings in this collection may be significant, but they remain to be developed.