Advances in Experimental Philosophy of Mind

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Justin Sytsma (ed.), Advances in Experimental Philosophy of Mind, Bloomsbury, 2014, 228pp., $112.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781472514806.

Reviewed by Kaija Mortensen, Randolph College


Justin Sytsma has assembled a useful snapshot of the current state of experimental philosophy of mind. Each article builds on a substantial body of previous work in psychology, experimental philosophy, and traditional philosophy. Because of this, the chapters deliver compelling contributions to the literature on mental state attributions, moral judgments, personal identity, and concepts; they also illustrate the methodological advantages of combining the strengths of experimental philosophy and traditional philosophy.

In his Introduction (Chapter 1), Sytsma notes that experimental philosophy seeks to better understand the human mind by investigating the cognitive processes that underlie our intuitive judgments. He further clarifies that experimental philosophy of mind distinguishes itself by focusing on intuitions about conscious mental states. While both psychology and philosophy of mind are interested in "how people ascribe mental states to themselves and others," Sytsma notes that philosophy's overwhelming interest in phenomenal states such as pain sets it apart from psychology's pervading interest in the predictive power of mental states like belief and desire (3).

In Chapter 2, "The Role of Intuition," Jennifer Nado observes that "experimental philosophy . . . invites us to reflect on the role of intuition in philosophical methodology" (11). This essay provides an impressively cogent, thorough roadmap to the central methodological debates regarding the evidential value of intuitions in philosophy, drawing on examples from the philosophy of mind. Nado uses her survey of the central arguments for and against intuition's evidential status to motivate traditional philosophy's need for experimental philosophy. After reviewing variation, calibration, and restriction arguments questioning the evidential status of intuition, Nado observes that only by thoroughly investigating (through experimental philosophy) the cognitive mechanisms behind our intuitive judgments can we get a better grip on the evidential status of particular intuitions.

Similarly, Nado argues against three prominent defenses of the use of intuitions in philosophy: the indispensability argument, the parity argument, and the constitutivity argument. Each of her challenges points to another way that experimental philosophy can further the goals of traditional philosophizing. To those who argue that intuition is a single, unified category of mental state that is indispensible for providing evidence in philosophy, Nado argues that intuitions are not monolithic and that experimental philosophy can help us determine if "the capacity for intuitive judgment is in fact unified, or whether it is more usefully subdivided into several fairly heterogeneous cognitive mechanisms or processes" (29).

To those who argue that intuition is a basic evidential source like perception, Nado argues we need a "deeper theoretical understanding of the cognitive mechanisms behind our intuitions" available through experimental philosophy to assess the similiarites (30). Lastly, building on the work of Alvin Goldman and Michael Devitt, Nado states that "psychological investigation can provide the metaphysical prescriptivist with error theories" (36). Nado closes by responding to Herman Cappelen's eliminativism about intuition. She writes that even if there is no special evidential state called "intuition", "a psychological story about the sources of our judgments is still extremely useful. Perhaps experimental philosophy can be more usefully conceived of as the study of the psychological processes underlying reasoning about philosophical questions" (39).

Chapters 3 and 4 focus on two pervasive notions in philosophy of mind that are generally taken for granted: (1) the standard intuition that Ned Block's Chinese nation thought experiment elicits against functionalism as a viable theory of mind, and (2) the common view that pain is private, subjective, and cannot be hallucinated. Both chapters argue that most people do not actually have the intuitions philosophers assume we share. In addition, both chapters engage a rich literature, both traditional and experimental, and use experimental methods to extend the traditional philosophical method of proposing theories and counterexamples to test and refine an analysis.

In Chapter 3, "Phenomenal Consciousness Disembodied," Wesley Buckwalter and Mark Phelan argue that the embodiment thesis is wrong. Previous experimental philosophy studies have argued that the embodiment hypothesis -- the view that one must have a biological body in order to have phenomenal mental states -- is an important principle of folk psychology guiding mental state ascription. Buckwalter and Phelan observe that the results of those previous studies "might in fact be trading on subtle cues and distractions related to the functional organization of target entities" (48). As such, they design and present the results of five studies to "see if ascriptions of phenomenal states to [entities lacking a biological body] differ from ascriptions made about normal human beings, or if they tend to work in the same basic way" (49). While previous studies supporting the embodiment thesis have studied mental attributions to group entities such as corporations, etc., Buckwalter and Phelan focus on disembodied entities like ghosts and spirits. In opposition to previous experimental philosophy studies, Buckwalter and Phelan find that people are actually perfectly willing to attribute phenomenal mental states to disembodied beings.

This discussion contributes to ongoing conversations about phenomenal states and functionalism by refining our understanding of the relationship between the two. Instead of merely corroborating or overthrowing Block's challenge to functionalism, Buckwalter and Phelan dig deeper in an attempt to understand the specific ways in which embodiment and the functional roles of phenomenal states interact to produce our attributions of those mental states to others.

The methodology employed here represents the best of survey-driven, vignette-based experimental philosophy. A vignette is presented. Responses are recorded and analyzed. In response to possible objections as to whether the first survey properly answered the target question, a replication is performed in which an element of the survey is changed to remove potentially biasing information. Then the experiment is run again to replicate the results with a different type of disembodied being, and the process continues. This clearly illustrates the methodological continuity between traditional thought experiment driven armchair philosophy and survey driven experimental philosophy. Each subsequent revision of the vignette is intended to head off a possible objection to the first vignette. Through this process, the experimenters hone in on the factors they most want to understand; they weed out the signal from the noise.

This chapter illustrates the advantages of deploying experimental methods in conversation with traditional methods. Buckwalter and Phelan were able to turn their hesitance about the embodiment thesis into a testable hypothesis rather than just trying to construct a thought experiment to pump an opposing intuition. Also, by working their way systematically through a series of experiments, Buckwalter and Phelan were able to do more than vaguely confirm their own intuitions. They were able to identify unexpected patterns in survey responses that indicated a more complex relationship between functional descriptions and phenomenal states than originally suggested by the embodiment hypothesis or its negation.

But notice also that experimental methods can't solve philosophical problems in isolation from traditional philosophical methods. Traditional philosophizing produced the theory of functionalism, Block's ingenious intuition-driven critique, and a host of responses to that critique. What traditional philosophy couldn't do on its own was investigate the cognitive processes behind Block's intuition to figure out what kind of evidence it was actually producing in relationship to functionalism.

Like Chapter 3, Chapter 4 nicely illustrates the value of experimental philosophy when effectively embedded in a deep understanding of the philosophical issue at play. In "Hallucinating Pain," Kevin Reuter, Dustin Phillips, and Justin Sytsma argue that, contrary to popular philosophical belief, phenomenal states like pain can be hallucinated, challenging at least some of the introspective data that supports dualism. Like the work of Buckwalter and Phelan, Reuter, Phillips and Sytsma present data from multiple studies, each centering around a vignette and each systematically adjusting variables to test possible objections to their findings.

This chapter contributes to ongoing debates regarding the nature of pain, and the viability of dualism as an accurate theory of mind, by providing reasons to think that our ordinary notion of pain does not operate as philosophers assume.

Chapters 5 and 6 investigate the relationship between morality and emotion using a somewhat different methodology. In both chapters, a host of data is considered (from survey data to neuroimaging data), and alternative models of the relationship between morality and emotion are proposed. Both articles are particularly interested in the relationships between the intentional stance, the phenomenal stance, and the physical stance. In Chapter 5, "Taking an 'Intentional Stance' on Moral Psychology," Jordan Theriault and Liane Young weigh the advantages and disadvantages of three different models that might accurately describe the relationship between mental state ascriptions and moral judgments, while in Chapter 6, "More Than a Feeling: Counterintuitive Effects of Compassion on Moral Judgment," Anthony Jack, Philip Robbins, Jared Friedman, and Chris Meyers strongly advocate for the benefits of a model which more thoroughly integrates our affective and cognitive capacities over Joshua Greene's dual process model that holds our reason and our passion in tension.

Chapter 5 urges philosophers to move beyond the view that our representations of others' minds are accurately captured by a single dimension -- agency (the intentional stance) or experience (the phenomenal stance). By providing reasons to believe that neither of these accounts properly captures our moral concern for others, Theriault and Young suggest that our representation of other minds involves both the intentional stance and the phenomenological stance. Methodologically, this chapter illustrates the importance of surveying a large swath of literature in both psychology and philosophy in order to best understand "the multiple sources of our moral standing" (119).

Chapter 6 deploys a wide range of experimental methods including self-reporting, behavioral data, neuroimaging, correlational analysis, and standard vignette-based surveys. The authors weave together these diverse sources of data to challenge Greene's application of dual process theory to understanding moral reasoning. Much experimental philosophy demonstrates this same tendency. What appears black and white from the armchair (for example, either we attribute mental states on the basis of functionalist cues or we don't; moral reasoning is governed either by the intentional stance or the phenomenal stance; moral reasoning is driven either by reasons or by passions) gets much more complex as we experimentally "zoom in" on each philosophically salient mental phenomena. As we come to understand how the folk deploy various philosophical concepts, diametrically opposed philosophical views suddenly become compatible and cooperative, both playing crucial roles in our cognitive machinery.

The last two chapters of the volume expand the range of topics and methodologies covered in the anthology. However, because neither article is paired with similar work on similar topics, the conclusions drawn seem isolated and disconnected from larger conversations in experimental philosophy of mind. Perhaps this is merely because others have yet to take up the gauntlet thrown down by these authors. While these last two chapters give the reader a sense of what experimental inquiry looks like at the early stages of an investigation, before dozens of studies have been authored on the topic, they lack a clear connection to the issues that originally motivated the volume.

Nevertheless, the contribution of Chapter 7 is noteworthy. The argumentative approach taken by "How Many of Us Are There?" will be familiar to readers, as these studies use the survey methodology employed in Chapters 3 and 4. In addition, the authors Hannah Tierney, Chris Howard, Victor Kumar, Trevor Kvaran, and Shaun Nichols employ a new methodology -- manipulation studies -- to good effect. The authors argue that "the folk are not monists about personal identity" (182). Instead, they demonstrate that the folk have multiple concepts of personal identity that they deploy in different situations. This conclusion is drawn on the basis of studies that start by "manipulating how people think about the self and then explore how this affects judgment and decision-making" (184).

While summaries of traditional philosophical arguments are used in Chapters 3 and 4 primarily to motivate the need for experimental philosophy, Chapter 7 engages traditional philosophical arguments about personal identity in the process of reflecting on and drawing conclusions from the experimental studies presented. Here, philosophical arguments are deployed to show that pluralism about personal identity is not a result of incompatible psychological systems working simultaneously, but instead that pluralism about personal identity constitutes a coherent philosophical position. It is refreshing to see this substantial philosophical claim made on the basis of experimental results equally yoked with traditional philosophizing to bear the argumentative load. I would have been happy to see the volume end with this example of fruitful cooperation between experimental and traditional philosophical methods.

Unfortunately, both the subject matter and the methodology of Chapter 8 stand somewhat removed from the rest. While there is no doubt that the study of concepts is central to the philosophy of mind -- after all, one's understanding of concepts is deeply connected to one's understanding of the cognitive machinery of the mind -- the studies here presented appeal to intuitions in a way more methodologically in harmony with linguistics than the other philosophy of mind studies in this volume. In "Concepts: Investigating the Heterogeneity Hypothesis," Edouard Machery provides new evidence in support of a hypothesis he has supported in previous work. He presents "a series of studies indicating that a substantial proportion of English speakers are willing to endorse a surprising range of seemingly contradictory sentences" (8). He takes this as evidence for the claim that "concepts don't form a unified kind, but instead split into three types that have little in common -- prototypes, exemplars, and causal theories" (7).

Machery's contribution raises the persistent question that nags at the heels of all experimental philosophy -- where does one draw the line between psychology and philosophy, between the descriptive and the normative? This question is particularly troublesome for experimental philosophy of mind, given that philosophy of mind is, by its very nature, a more descriptive enterprise than some other domains of philosophy, and one that has embraced the value of empirical data more quickly than some other philosophical disciplines. However, it is helpful to bear in mind the distinction Systma draws between philosophy and psychology early in the volume: while both are interested in mental state attributions, psychologists have traditionally been concerned with the role beliefs and desires play in predicting behavior whereas philosophers of mind have ultimately been puzzled by the hard problem of consciousness, which has its roots in our attributions of phenomenal mental states. As the other contributions illustrate, traditional and philosophical methods must work hand in hand to deepen our understanding of the cognitive machinery that produces our own phenomenal mental states and our attribution of such mental states to others. Machery's work on concepts seems more in line with psychologists' interest in predicting behavior than it does with philosophers' interest in the puzzles raised by phenomenal states. As such, Chapter 8 brings an otherwise compelling volume to an unsatisfactory close.