Advances in Religion, Cognitive Science, and Experimental Philosophy

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Helen De Cruz and Ryan Nichols (eds.), Advances in Religion, Cognitive Science, and Experimental Philosophy, Bloomsbury, 2016, 221pp., $112.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781474223843.

Reviewed by Justin Sytsma, Victoria University of Wellington


I was both surprised and excited to see the announcement for this new entry in the Advances in Experimental Philosophy series. I was surprised because I was aware of very little work in experimental philosophy of religion. I was excited because I've been thrilled with experimental philosophy's growth over the past fifteen years and welcome its expansion into philosophy of religion. When I picked up this volume, I was expecting to read a collection of cutting-edge articles in experimental philosophy of religion. By and large that is not what I found, however. Despite the series and despite the title, the volume's focus is better described by the subtitle of Cruz and Nichols's introduction -- "Cognitive Science of Religion and Its Philosophical Implications."

Given this focus, it is worth noting that I am an experimental philosopher and not a philosopher of religion or a student of religion more generally. As such, I primarily engaged with the volume from the perspective of an amateur. That said, I quite enjoyed the collection. It provides a fascinating overview of the cognitive science of religion (CSR) -- an interdisciplinary field applying methods from cognitive and evolutionary sciences to the study of religious belief and behavior -- and how some of the lessons from this field bear on philosophy of religion. For researchers looking for a philosophically-informed introduction to CSR exploring how philosophy of religion can benefit from this work, the volume is definitely worth a read.

The volume consists of an introduction by the editors and nine other chapters. The latter can be divided, roughly, into those that engage with either the general thrust of CSR (Chapters 2-4) or recent empirical findings from CSR (Chapters 6 and 10) from a philosophical perspective, those that survey some recent research in CSR from a largely non-philosophical perspective (Chapters 5 and 8), and those that present new empirical results (Chapters 7 and 9).

In their introduction, De Cruz and Nichols note two ways in which philosophy can be empirically informed, distinguishing between empirical philosophy and experimental philosophy. The key difference is whether the researchers themselves employ empirical methods or simply rely on the empirical results of others. De Cruz and Nichols go on to apply this to philosophy of religion, distinguishing between empirical philosophy of religion and experimental philosophy of religion (EPR). With regard to the former, they focus on what philosophers can learn from CSR. And they note that in comparison, EPR is "somewhat narrower in scope since it aims to have a direct relevance for philosophical questions" (4). They do not mention the flip-side of this coin, however: a major motivation for experimental philosophy is that researchers in other disciplines often aren't interested in quite the same questions that philosophers are, and the available empirical results reflect this. One upshot is that empirical philosophy is typically not a true alternative to experimental philosophy. Generally, if a philosopher wants targeted empirical data on a given philosophical claim, she needs to go out and collect it herself.

Rather than urge philosophers to engage with the existing empirical literature and to contribute to it when called for, however, De Cruz and Nichols pit CSR against EPR and find EPR wanting. For example, they assert that "fewer methods are available to EPR" (4). It is far from clear why we should think this is the case, but even if we accept it there is reason to doubt the value of the comparison. What would seem to be more relevant than the relative size of one's toolbox is whether one is using tools that are appropriate to the task. And, as it turns out, many of the specific studies reported in the volume use questionnaire methods, such as the research by Legare and Souza (2012) that is at the heart of Chapter 5, by Gervais and Norenzayan (2012) that is the focus of Chapter 6, by De Cruz that is reported in Chapter 7, and by White and colleagues presented in Chapter 9.

Despite this, De Cruz and Nichols go on to claim that the "methods in CSR tend to be stable and reliable in contrast to often simpler methods, experimental designs, and statistical testing found in experimental philosophy" and that "Only methods and statistical analyses in CSR, not EPR, afford us the ability to understand influences, mechanisms, and robust correlations between findings about religious cognition, belief, and emotion" (5). Unfortunately, no support is offered for these bald assertions. And even if they are correct about the state of these fields today, the point remains that this is not an either/or. Instead the concern might more fruitfully be pitched in terms of CSR providing a potential source of inspiration for EPR. Philosophers can learn from CSR, and they can conduct their own empirical research when called for.

In Chapter 2, John S. Wilkins considers how evolutionary debunking arguments apply to both religion and science. He argues that while our best current accounts tend to debunk religious beliefs by casting doubt on the reasons for thinking those beliefs are true, the same does not hold for scientific beliefs, since "the fitness of the beliefs tracks environmental truth for common sense, and the extreme costs of error elimination are borne in science in ways that it is not in religion" (33). In Chapter 3, John Teehan notes a response that theists can make to concerns that the general cognitive model coming out of CSR debunks religious belief -- one could offer a "cognitively natural theology" that posits that God worked through evolution to bring about beings like us. Teehan, in turn, responds that such a theism is inconsistent with a natural account of human evil, arguing that "moral evil (at least some of the worst examples) flows from the workings of mental tools that evolved to promote inclusive fitness and in-group fitness" (48). And from this, he concludes that if God is responsible for our evolution, then God is responsible for moral evil and theodicy fails. While Teehan offers an updated version of the argument from evil based on CSR, in Chapter 4 Jason Marsh and Jon Marsh offer an updated version of the challenge of religious diversity: "Why, if some particular theistic outlook is true, and if it's urgent that everyone believes that outlook, would God design the world in such a way that serious religious diversity naturally arises?" (70).

Together, the first three essays offer a compelling glimpse into how the general thrust of CSR can inform, and deepen, perennial issues in philosophy of religion. Chapters 6 and 10 engage with more specific findings from the literature. In Chapter 6, Kelly James Clark considers recent studies suggesting that analytic cognitive processing promotes religious disbelief. He argues that such studies "do not show the rational superiority of unbelief over religious belief" (104). In Chapter 10, K. Mitch Hodge looks at the source of afterlife beliefs. He begins by noting the "long-held and largely unchallenged assumption . . . that we, humans, have and hold afterlife beliefs because we fear our own death" (197). Against this Hodge considers empirical results that he takes to suggest that this assumption is mistaken, with afterlife beliefs instead being generated by thinking about the death of others. He then offers "an alternative empirically testable theory" (206) that better accounts for these results. This marks one spot where some work in experimental philosophy would have been a valuable addition. While Hodge's speculation is interesting, I can't help but wish that he had actually tested his theory.

Chapters 5 and 8 focus on the science. In Chapter 5, Christine H. Legare, Rachel E. Watson-Jones, and Andre L. Souza look at work on ritual efficacy. Most notably, they discuss the work of Legare and Souza (2012), which elicited judgments about a set of novel simpatias (rituals used in Brazil for addressing common problems). They found that the results are readily interpreted in terms of ordinary causal beliefs about the efficacy of our actions. In Chapter 8, Benjamin Grant Purzycki and Rita Anne McNamara pursue an evolutionary cognitive ecology of religion, focusing on how people represent the minds of gods across cultures. They hypothesize that "changing local social and ecological problems that stem from the complex interactions between humans and their natural environments will predict the content of representational models of gods' minds" (145).

The remaining two chapters present new empirical results. It should be pointed out, however, that the study reported by De Cruz and Johan De Smedt in Chapter 7 was first reported in De Cruz (2014), although they describe it as simply giving a preliminary analysis. In this chapter they note that theists are disproportionately represented in philosophy of religion and that several non-theists have argued that this is unhealthy for the field. The worry is that theists will be overly influenced by their prior religious beliefs and won't evaluate religious arguments objectively. De Cruz and De Smedt attempt to bring empirical evidence to bear on this worry. De Cruz gave participants (primarily philosophers) the names of eight arguments for theism (e.g., "cosmological argument") and eight arguments against theism (e.g., "argument from evil") and asked them to rate the strength of each. Participants also answered demographic questions, including whether they identified as "theist," "atheist," or "agnostic/undecided."

De Cruz and De Smedt predicted that "philosophers evaluate arguments that support their prior beliefs as stronger than those that disconfirm their beliefs" (124). And the results are consistent with this prediction. They found that "theists rated arguments that support theism significantly higher than atheists, whereas atheists rated arguments against theism significantly higher than theists" (124). But what should we make of this finding?

In their introduction, De Cruz and Nichols cited four examples of experimental philosophy of religion, one being the present chapter (the only chapter noted from the present volume). One of the other three is Kevin Tobia (2015), which reports a follow-up to the present study. Tobia conducted this follow-up, in part, because he notes a plausible alternative interpretation of De Cruz's study: "Theists, well versed in theistic argument, might recall the best version of an argument for theism . . . atheists, on the other hand, might recall the best version of an argument for atheism" (2). Given that De Cruz was aware of this response at the time of writing the introduction, it is unfortunate that it is not explicitly addressed in this chapter.

De Cruz and De Smedt do attempt to assess "whether philosophical specialization has an effect that is independent from religious belief" (127), however, and this might be thought to help address Tobia's concern. It could be argued that if Tobia's objection is correct, then we would expect to find that philosophers of religion would give higher ratings to the arguments. Unfortunately, the analysis presented does not clearly address Tobia's objection since no overall comparison is reported. Rather, De Cruz and De Smedt selectively report some of the comparisons for the sixteen individual argument names tested. De Cruz and De Smedt offer no prior predictions about these relationships, however. Instead they issue a cautionary note: "as this is an exploratory study, where we are mainly interested in detecting potential patterns and less in avoiding false positives, we have not used Bonferroni or other methods of correction for multiple comparisons" (127). This is seriously problematic for a number of reasons.

When the analysis for philosophical specialization was first reported in De Cruz (2014), the study was not described as exploratory and no such cautionary note was presented. At this time, she reported a single comparison: "participants who are philosophers of religion (controlling for other factors like gender and religious belief) are 1.53 times as likely as those who were not to rate the cosmological argument as strong or very strong (p=.01)" (494). No indication was given of why De Cruz focused on this comparison and no mention was made of conducting multiple comparisons. Overall, little information is offered about the analysis, although De Cruz does note that "These ratios were computed using an ordered logit/cumulative logit model" and thanks Robert O'Brien "for help with this calculation" (Footnote 2).

De Cruz and De Smedt report the same comparison with the same p-value (and the same lack of detailed information) in their chapter. They then note seven further comparisons where p<0.05. And in line with De Cruz (2014), they report that they used a "logit-probit model for the arguments for theism, and a cumulative logit model without proportional odds for the arguments against theism" (127) and thank Robert O'Brien "for calculating these statistics" (Footnote 4). A similar analysis is then offered for gender.

It is unfortunate that De Cruz and De Smedt didn't provide us with full details of their analysis or with all of the numbers for the comparisons they ran. Absent this information, it is unclear what, if anything, should be drawn from these discussions. What is relatively clear, though, is that even with a cautionary note it is highly questionable to include p-values for only a sub-set of the comparisons and to do so without predictions and without correcting for multiple comparisons. The danger is that people will see the p-values and interpret these findings as if they indicate statistical significance. In fact, De Cruz and De Smedt go on to do exactly that, claiming that they "found several factors that significantly influence the appraisal of natural theological arguments" (130) including philosophical specialization and gender. But this is hardly supported by the analysis reported.

There is another interesting divergence between the discussion in De Cruz (2014) and the present chapter. In her previous article, De Cruz notes that her results do not establish causation, then argues that there are independent reasons for drawing a causal arrow from religious belief to evaluation of the arguments (493-494). While I am not convinced by this argument -- in part because it does not address the alternative possibility that there is a common cause between religious belief and evaluation of well-known theological arguments[1] -- the more important point for present purposes is that De Cruz and De Smedt do not even raise this concern. Instead, they simply move from providing evidence of a correlation, to the use of language that suggests a causal relationship, to interpreting the study as supporting a causal explanation in terms of confirmation bias.

Of course, establishing causation is no easy task, especially in a case like the present one. That said, there are further steps that could have been taken. We saw that in their introduction, De Cruz and Nichols compare experimental philosophy negatively to CSR, noting its "simpler methods, experimental designs, and statistical testing." One method that has been gaining popularity in experimental philosophy, however, is the use of causal search -- that is, methods of attempting to discover causal structure on the basis of patterns of statistical association and independence.[2] It is unfortunate that De Cruz and De Smedt did not lead by example, employing a more sophisticated analysis.

In Chapter 9, Claire White, Robert Kelly, and Shaun Nichols also present empirical results. They report on a pair of fascinating studies investigating the factors driving belief in past lives. While White and colleagues do not bring these results to bear on an explicitly philosophical question -- justifying De Cruz and Nichols's implicit treatment of this chapter as work in CSR rather than EPR -- the research is nonetheless a shining example of how philosophers can contribute to interdisciplinary empirical research. White and colleagues draw on philosophical and scientific work on personal identity and memory to derive the intriguing hypothesis that belief in past lives is driven by memory, and specifically by episodic memory, which carries with it a sense of personal identity. This hypothesis was supported by the results of two studies surveying adults who believe that they have lived one or more past lives.

Overall, De Cruz and Nichols have produced an engaging volume and I recommend it to those interested in the interplay between cognitive science of religion and philosophy of religion. That said, the volume falls short with regard to providing advances in experimental philosophy. Further, both the discussion of experimental philosophy of religion in the introduction and the example given in Chapter 7 detract from what is otherwise an enjoyable volume.


I want to thank Jonathan Livengood, David Rose, Kevin Tobia, Joe Ulatowski, and Dan Weijers for helpful feedback on previous drafts of this review.


Danks, David (2016). "Causal Search, Causal Modeling, and the Folk," in A Companion to Experimental Philosophy, edited by J. Sytsma and W. Buckwalter, Blackwell.

De Cruz, Helen (2014). "Cognitive Science of Religion and the Study of Theological Concepts," Topoi, 33: 487-497.

Gervais, Will and Ara Norenzayan (2012). "Analytic Thinking Promotes Religious Disbelief," Science, 336: 493-496.

Legare, Christine and André Souza (2012). "Evaluating ritual efficacy: Evidence from the supernatural," Cognition, 124: 1-15.

Livengood, Jonathan, Justin Sytsma, Adam Feltz, Richard Scheines, and Edouard Machery (2010). "Philosophical Temperament," Philosophical Psychology, 23(3): 313-330.

Sytsma, Justin and Jonathan Livengood (2016). The Theory and Practice of Experimental Philosophy. Broadview.

Tobia, Kevin (2015). "Does religious belief infect philosophical analysis?", Religion, Brain and Behavior.

[1] In fact, the previous chapter suggests one plausible common cause. In Chapter 6, Clark discusses research showing a negative correlation between analytic cognitive processing and religious belief. Further, Livengood et al. (2010) have shown that there is a positive correlation between analytic cognitive processing and philosophical training. Based on this, one might hypothesize that lower analytic cognitive processing affects both religious belief and argument assessment.

[2] See Danks (2016) for a discussion, including examples from the literature; see Chapter 14 of Sytsma and Livengood (2016) an introductory guide to causal search in R.