Adventures in Transcendental Materialism: Dialogues with Contemporary Thinkers

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Adrian Johnston, Adventures in Transcendental Materialism: Dialogues with Contemporary Thinkers, Edinburgh University Press, 2014, 358pp., $39.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780748673292.

Reviewed by John Protevi, Louisiana State University


Adrian Johnston's work in this new volume of essays is challenging, erudite, and very important. He seeks to bring Hegel, Marx, Freud, and Lacan into contact with certain non-reductionist, non-determinist programs in the life sciences and neurosciences (the pair "epigenetics and neuroplasticity" appears at several points) in order to distinguish his work from that of his closest, though friendly rivals. These are Slavoj Žižek, Alain Badiou, Catherine Malabou, Quentin Meillassoux, Markus Gabriel and Martin Hägglund. He also has a rather more oppositional, and indeed sometimes polemical, relation with those he deems neo-Spinozist, here represented by Iain Hamilton Grant, Jane Bennett, and William Connolly.

This review will have two parts. In the first section I will place Johnston in relation to his friendly rivals; in the second I will pose some critical remarks regarding Johnston's enlisting of various scientific and philosophical practices under his rubric of "strong emergence" of a "more-than-natural" subjectivity.


In the first part then, I will indicate the singular points of Johnston's portrayal, in this book, of his system of "transcendental materialism."[1] In the interests of space (and as a result of the limits of my training), I will pass by, with regret, the many detailed passages in which Johnston distinguishes his psychoanalytic readings from those of Žižek, Badiou, Malabou, and Hägglund. Instead I will concentrate on the singular points of the ontological position Johnston stakes out. That is, I will identify the points on the near side of which one is in Johnston's system, and on the far side of which one leaves it. This is a topology of a conceptual space: you can twist and pull on Johnston's concepts to a certain extent, but there are points beyond which things change too much for it to be considered still his system. So the first part of the review is not really about correspondence: does Johnston get it right relative to the way the world works? Or coherence: who agrees with Johnston? Or pragmatics: what can you do with Johnston? But, about a sort of philosophical mapping: where does Johnston's system force a choice on you?

I will concentrate on the singular points of Johnston's ontological system. As I read this book, Johnston's primary concern is the relation of substance and subject, or that of matter and mind. An early gloss on the key term, "transcendental materialism," sees it as an "account of the emergence of self-determining, auto-reflexive transcendental subjectivity out of asubjective substance, [which] also fairly could be depicted as a genetic, temporally elongated (meta-)transcendentalism" (18). As we can see, Johnston affirms the Hegelian imperative of "grasping and expressing the True, not only as Substance but equally as Subject" (27; see also 173 and 308; emphasis in original; citing the Phenomenology of Spirit). In working with "substance" and "subject" as basic terms, Johnston also uses "mind and matter," stressing their irreducibility once the mental emerges from the material. This gives us one of our first singular points, distinguishing transcendental materialism from dialectical materialism:

whereas certain versions of Hegelian-Marxist dialectical materialism tend to emphasize possible unifying syntheses of such apparent splits as that between mind and matter, transcendental materialism treats these splits as real and irreducible (while nevertheless depicting them as internally generated out of a single, sole plane of material being). (13)

The reality and irreducibility of mind or subjectivity is termed "strong emergence" by Johnston, which he will distinguish from both weak emergence and epiphenomenalism, as well as from panpsychism. Weak emergence would posit a real but dependent, not really free or autonomous subjectivity, whereas epiphenomenalism denies the reality and causal efficacy of subjectivity. Panpsychism, which Johnston describes in extreme terms, goes too far the other way from epiphenomenalism, seeing full-blown subjectivity everywhere. Hence Johnston must distinguish Hegel's "panlogism" from "panpsychism." Hegel is a panlogist in the sense that "To be knowable in and through subjects' thoughts, asubjective things must not be wholly alien and completely foreign to the forms and contents of thoughts" (42). But he is no panpsychist: "Hegel's panlogism is far from hypothesizing anything panpsychical, since ascribing knowability to something by no means entails attributing knowledge of itself (through reflective/reflexive self-awareness/consciousness) to this same something" (43). This very strong notion of panpsychism is another singular point; most panpsychisms allow a gradient, with only some sort of very faint glimmer of sentience at the lowest levels.

In any case, with this substance/subject orientation, Johnston affirms an "axiomatic positing" of real, autonomous subjectivity that leads to the "reverse engineering "of a nature capable of producing such subjectivity:

Transcendental materialism starts with a decision to commit to an axiomatic positing of the real existence of subjects as transcendental, autonomous, and irreducible free agents of negativity nonetheless immanent/internal to the physical realities constituted by material bodies (in this respect, it can be viewed as a materialist recasting of the methodology and starting point of Fichteanism). Its ontology of objective first nature is then reverse-engineered out of this commitment to there being an ineliminable facticity of subjective (as well as objective) second nature. (18)

This brings us to Johnston's very close relation with Žižek. Two singular points appear here, dividing Johnston from Žižek: the proper science for grounding transcendental materialism, and the relation of positivity to negativity.

With regard to science, the key division here is that Johnston thinks biology rather than quantum physics, as with Žižek, offers the best scientific grounding for transcendental materialism (16). (The relation to science is also among the points that divide Johnston from Badiou and Malabou. While Johnston's preference for the life sciences distinguishes him from the mathematically oriented Badiou, he agrees with Malabou that neuroscience is the key science. However, Malabou thinks the findings of neuroscience outstrip the ability of psychoanalysis to deal with real neuronal/subjective destruction, while Johnston thinks a properly reformatted psychoanalysis retains some utility even there.[2])

To return to Johnston and Žižek, and shifting from a scientific focus to ontology, Johnston wants to look for the "genesis of negativity out of positivity" (the emergence of subject from substance, to use the Hegelian terms), while Žižek's focus is on the "explosion of positivity out of negativity" (17). Except for these relatively subtle differences, Johnston thinks their positions are closer than Žižek recognizes:

Žižek's tethering of so-called dialectical materialism to an ontology of a self-sundering substance internally generating parallax-style antinomies and oppositions seems more like a sort of genetic transcendentalism, a theory centered on the model of a trajectory involving the immanent genesis of the thereafter-transcendent (i.e., an emergentist supplement to Kantian transcendental idealism). One could call this, as I have done, "transcendental materialism," defined as a doctrine based on the thesis that materiality manufactures out of itself that which comes to detach from and achieve independence in relation to it. (118)

This notion of immanent materiality's manufacturing of a thereafter-transcendent subjectivity brings us back to Johnston's programmatic statement of transcendental materialism as "a genetic, temporally elongated (meta-)transcendentalism" (18). Several singular points appear here with Johnston's linear temporality of emergence (first there was matter, then its composition allowed for mind), which distinguish his position from a classic explication of the spiritual aspects of nature. In those systems, history is merely a finite perspective, either the explication of an a priori implication or the progressive materialization or emanation of a pure spirit. For the materialist Johnston, however, history is not an explication, much less an emanation.  Rather, it is all there is; at a particular point in linear time subjectivity emerges, a new event in the world. (Johnston has a very complex notion of psychoanalytic temporality that he rehearses in the chapters on Hägglund.)

We see then the way Johnston's ontological focus provides singular points dividing his work from that of two recently appearing European philosophers, Meillassoux and Gabriel. Contra the epistemological question posed by Meillassoux -- who wants to know "how the subjective mind transcends itself so as to make direct knowing contact objective world" -- Johnston wants to know "how this idealist correlationist circuit of subjectivity irrupts out of (and thereafter perturbs from within) the asubjective Real an sich of being qua being (l'être en tant qu'être)" (15). Johnston's division from Gabriel remains ontological however, with the turning point being (partial) naturalism:

The ontology of Gabriel's transcendental ontology, itself resulting mainly from the gesture of ontologizing Kantian and post-Kantian transcendental subjectivity, is a vision of being as a non-hierarchized, detotalized plurality of 'fields of sense' defying grounding capture by any type of naturalism and/or science-allied materialism. (26)

But for Johnston, his "materialist leanings incline me to see 'fields of sense' as arising from embodied minded beings in ways at least partially explicable in natural-scientific (especially biological) terms" (26).


In this second part of the review, I continue with the mapping, but concentrate on the singular point of divergence between strong and weak emergence. Let's turn to the school of enactivism, which can be represented here by Evan Thompson, and anachronistically extended backwards to Humberto Maturana and Francisco Varela. With some strain, it can also be extended horizontally to Antonio Damasio and Terrence Deacon, whom Johnston cites. Enactivism should, I think, be seen as weakly emergent; it acknowledges that full-blown self-consciousness is a diachronically emergent phenomenon, but it is not something radically or ontologically different from simpler forms of cognition and sentience. Johnston's claim of "more-than-natural" status for full self-conscious would disrupt what the emergentists call the continuity of mind-in-life (Thompson 2007).

Johnston's ontological concern with strong emergence along the lines of substance/subject or matter/mind provides the most important singular point dividing his conception from that of the enactivists. For Thompson's "mind in life" perspective, cognition is the direction of an organism in its co-constituted world. Here the question is not emergence of mind from matter, but, since cognition and life are co-extensive, the origin of life (Thompson 2007: 214-218). And that brings a singular point on the other side of enactivism's "biological panpsychism," that of various forms of strong panpsychism -- or better, pansentience -- without the "biological" modifier (Protevi 2011).

For Thompson the vocabulary of mind and matter brings out a badly posed problem. For him, it's not mind and (mindless) body, but the "two-body problem" of the living and lived body:

There does not seem to be any explanatory gap in the transition from seeing the body as a physical object to seeing it in its structural morphology as a living body. But there does seem to be a gap or discontinuity in the movement from seeing the body as a living body to seeing it as a lived body, as a locus of feeling and intentional activity -- in short as sentient. . . . We have had to jettison the traditional Cartesian vocabulary of mental versus physical entities and properties. The lived body is the living body; it is a dynamic condition of the living body. We could say that our lived body is a performance of our living body, something our body enacts in living. (Thompson 2007: 236-37; emphasis in original)

And with the "two-body problem" we can return again to the singular point between strong and weak emergence (and not that between strong emergence and epiphenomenalism). Johnston acknowledges that the scientists he enlists throughout (e.g., Maturana and Varela at 306-07; see also Deacon and Damasio at 56-61) are non-reductive, non-determinist naturalists (300-01), but he never draws the conclusion that this is compatible with -- nay, more congruent with -- weak emergence rather than strong emergence. Johnston writes of the "Earliest System-Program of German Idealism" that its author is, with regard to moral beings,

raising the question of how to reconceptualize ontological substantiality so as to incorporate, as (still) fully immanent to such substantiality, the more-than-substantial free subjects (as sentient and sapient auto-relating self-determinant not directly determined by iron-clad metaphysical laws of externally dictated efficient causality, whether physical or biological) back within this ground of being which gave rise to such subjects to begin with. (310)

This position of strong emergence is also characterized as needing a nature that is "torn or shattered to pieces by creating within itself the weird cognitive-emotional-motivational beings that can and do turn back upon it (with these beings achieving an auto-reflexive self-determination" (307).

It is, however, difficult to accept Johnston's categorization of Maturana and Varela (1980, 1987), or of Varela, Thompson and Rosch (1991), as strong emergentists at 307. Without being able to fully prove the point here (I have a more full development of the following notions in Protevi 2009), it does seem to me that the notion of autonomy springing from that of organizational closure (the generic term within which autopoiesis is a physical instantiation -- at least for Varela) would never be taken by them to mean Johnstonian "self-determining subjects," as organism and world are always co-constituted. It is true that an autonomous system in the Varelean sense is only perturbed by the world when conditions relative to the survival values of the system change, thus unleashing characteristic behaviors that then bring it back to homeostasis, but it cannot act except in conditions of "coupling" with the world. Varelean subjects are autonomous in his sense, yes, but they are never fully self-determining; they would seem to me to be much more in line with at least some of the markers of weak emergence (excepting the "vital"): "immanent naturalist vital materialism of a flat, even, and democratic first nature of weakly emerging not-quite-subjects" (314).

The problem with calling the enactivists strong emergentists is that you can avoid epiphenomenalist reduction by weak emergence as well as strong. The recourse to dynamic systems theory by contemporary scientists (see the précis in Thompson 2007, 417-41) allows a reconceptualization of final and/or "downward" causality (Juarrero 1999; see DeLanda 2002 for a Deleuzean uptake) beyond that of "iron clad laws of externally dictated efficient causality" (the epiphenomenalist position) without needing -- or even desiring -- to go all the way to strong emergence and its "axiomatic positing of the real existence of transcendental, autonomous, and irreducible free agents of negativity" (18). Thus a final singular point: avoiding epiphenomenalism still leaves a second division between weak and strong emergence.

These are difficult and challenging concepts, and perhaps the singular point of divergence between strong and weak emergence admits of further internal distinctions (perhaps it's a fractal zone or strange attractor, to continue with the mapping metaphor one last time). But whatever one makes of the importance of the encounter with enactivism, Johnston's work should be read and discussed widely. I could not agree more with him on the need for continental philosophy to engage with the neurosciences and life sciences at the intersection of metaphysics, psychology, and politics. I recommend grappling with this book, even if I have indicated with some brief remarks on enactivism places of perhaps misplaced emphasis or overly strong interpretation.


DeLanda, Manuel. 2002. Intensive Science and Virtual Philosophy, London: Continuum.

Juarrero, Alicia. 1999. Dynamics in Action: Intentional Behavior as a Complex System. Cambridge MA: MIT Press.

Maturana, Humberto, and Varela, Francisco. 1980. Autopoiesis and Cognition: The Realization of the Living. Dordrecht: Riedel.

Maturana, Humberto, and Varela, Francisco. 1987. The Tree of Knowledge: The Biological Roots of Human Understanding. Boston: New Science Library.

Protevi, John. 2009. Beyond Autopoiesis: Inflections of Emergence and Politics in Francisco Varela. In Emergence and Embodiment: New Essays on Second-Order Systems Theory, ed. Bruce Clark and Mark Hansen. Durham NC: Duke University Press: 94-112.

Protevi, John. 2011. Mind in Life, Mind in Process: Toward a New Transcendental Aesthetic and a New Question of Panpsychism. Journal of Consciousness Studies 18, nos 5-6: 94-116.

Thompson, Evan. 2007. Mind in Life: Biology, Phenomenology, and the Sciences of the Mind. Cambridge MA: Harvard University Press.

Varela, Francisco, Thompson, Evan, and Rosch, Eleanor. 1991. The Embodied Mind: Cognitive Science and Human Experience. Cambridge MA: MIT Press.

[1] See the NDPR review of his earlier Prolegomena to Any Future Materialism, Volume 1.

[2] See this NDPR review of their co-authored book Self and Emotional Life for details.