Aesthetic Democracy

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Thomas Docherty, Aesthetic Democracy, Stanford University Press, 2006, 185pp., $19.95 (pbk), ISBN 0804751897.
Villanova University

Reviewed by John Carvalho, Villanova University


You never judge a book by its cover, but you generally use a book's title as a guide to what you will find between its covers. In a book titled Aesthetic Democracy, for example, you might expect to find a discussion of the unity that gives to the diversity of a citizen body its distinctively democratic form of politics, or an analysis of the precise modeling of participation that best suits the aims of democracy, or a catalogue of the arts that best exemplify or support the participatory politics democracies ordinarily afford, or, even, speculation about the geography or city plan or form of life, the climate or the culture, the fashion sense or cuisine that facilitate or are most commonly associated with what we call democratic freedoms.

Aesthetic Democracy is not a book of political philosophy, however, and you will find nothing of the comparatively banal discussions just enumerated between its covers. Aesthetic Democracy is a work of literary criticism, and no one familiar with the many works by its author, Thomas Docherty, would expect otherwise. Not to say that the reach and import of this work are not political or philosophical. In fact, Docherty attempts nothing less in these pages than a deconstruction of political philosophy as it has been conceived and practiced in modernity. And we do not use the term "deconstruction" loosely in that last sentence as a substitute for criticism construed as evaluation and freighted with predictable prejudices about the right way to practice politics and philosophy. Rather, Docherty understands deconstruction as an analysis that forces both the subject and object of criticism to change, to become other than they are in the course of the analysis, and the name Docherty gives this becoming other, this deconstruction, is "aesthetics."

So, right away, aesthetics is rendered other than we ordinarily understand it, and Docherty puts this deconstructed understanding of aesthetics to work in his first chapters analyzing and rendering other or unfamiliar, in other words, deconstructing our ordinary understanding of democracy. In Docherty's analysis, democracy is not a condition or a state of affairs but an event that happens just in case potentially sovereign individuals make an exception of themselves in the act of representing who they are by inventing themselves beyond themselves or, more precisely, beyond their authentically European identities. The model for these exceptional individuals, as it turns out, is the dramatis persona Claribel from Shakespeare's The Tempest who "initiates a series of events," Docherty writes,

through which she becomes our African queen, even as she remains firmly European; and in those events … opens for us Europeans the question of what it might be to be beyond Europe. (158)

The great modern question for democratic politics, according to Docherty, is not autonomy (for which Hamlet is the paradigm) but sovereignty or mastery over the self (for which Claribel is the key) (156).

Through all this deconstruction -- of aesthetics, of politics and philosophy, of democracy and, even, Shakespeare -- Docherty performs something of a deconstruction of himself, becoming other than himself in response to his critical analyses of Plato and Socrates, Machiavelli and Rousseau, Milton, Eliot, Augustine, Kant, Montaigne, Hegel, Nietzsche, Benjamin, Lyotard, Derrida, Vattimo, Agamben and Badiou, as well as Shakespeare. Quite nearly every point in Docherty's three-part argument revolves around one or another of these and other conceptual personae, proper names with which Docherty associates an idea or a view. As a result, Docherty's final position is not so much a conclusion as itself an event that happens in the course of these encounters. The concept of aesthetic democracy in this book emerges much as the potential for aesthetic democracy will be realized, so Docherty urges, as an event that happens out of the inexhaustible potential for democracy that is Europe.

Docherty's question is not the philosopher's "What is aesthetic democracy?" but the critic's "What is required to make aesthetic democracy emerge?" How do we pass from a preoccupation with the state of affairs that gives to citizens an identity those same citizens produce by participating in the affairs of the state (which perforce precludes difference by excluding all those others who cannot be so identified because they do not participate) to a hospitality or, following Agamben, an amiability toward the other that embraces the other in her or his singularity. This singularity does not specify the particular properties of the other in contrast to what is universally or authentically human about her or him. Rather, it picks out whatever it is about the other (una singularità qualunque) that commands my love in all its uncertainty. What is at stake in the potential for democracy, according to Docherty, is our very humanity and a sense of freedom defined by this being toward love of the other that is utterly different than the models of freedom ordinarily associated with the American ideals of free markets, free speech and free and open elections. Democracy, on Docherty's account, is the inexhaustible potential for a being toward love of the other born of a sovereign sense of self which are both derived from the privileged inscription of the other in the origins of the modern form of democracy extant today and in the origins of the critical analysis -- the deconstruction -- that Docherty says modern democracy demands.

In the first part of his argument, Docherty locates the origins of deconstruction

in a complex relation involving Algeria (in the mode of nostalgérie), maternity, and the kinds of 'adoption' or adaptation that are inscribed in the consciousness of those who live in and through the postcolonial moment. (19)

In other words, deconstruction is somehow rooted in Derrida's experience of having been born and raised a Jew in an Arab country becoming self-conscious of its having been colonized by a Catholic, European nation. Because such colonization, and the "discoveries" of other than European peoples, in Africa and the Americas, is a significant feature of European nations in a state of transition from monarchal to democratic rule, a deconstruction of modern European democracy, so the argument goes, is not arbitrary but a necessary critical tool for understanding what democracy means, understood as a potential that can be located in its origins. In this stage of the argument, a critical analysis of the other figures prominently in reflections about the problem of and potential for modern European democracy.

In this account, the other is the one for whom democracy is a real possibility, the possibility even of maximizing her or his human potential, but Docherty wants to pass beyond this Deweyan platitude to a conceptualization of democracy as the Kierkegaardian "passion for the possible" that is always open to change. Thus, the second part of Docherty's argument presses for this possibility out of what he calls an ethics of ambiguity, the maintenance of a permanently open state that is not to be confused with "free choice" -- which Dewey himself recognized as mere 'economic individualism' -- but identified with a passion for an encounter with what is other in which it is possible to become other than ourselves. This encounter, Docherty says, "is dramatized for us in literature and in our critical engagement with it" (87). He goes so far as to describe this encounter as hypocritical, a "criticism under criticism," in which the reader does not presume an identity for herself prior to her encounter with what is potentially other in the text but remains open to being changed in the encounter. This openness and vulnerability of the reader serves as a model for the being toward love that Docherty recommends as the inauthentic or hypocritical path that sovereign individuals will follow toward aesthetic democracy.

Having come this far, the third turn in the argument leads this being toward love to what Docherty calls "sovereign democracy," the more permanent state for which aesthetic democracy is the event. Sovereign democracy is a polity composed of sovereign individuals who, because they are masters of themselves (and not, as autonomous individuals, masters of their situation), are free to fictionalize themselves, to be creatively hypocritical, to tell stories as a "means by which the truth of the private realm is made possible or realized" (113). "Fiction is strategic lying," Docherty writes, "but, importantly, the strategic goal is not deception but rather the establishment of the faiths, trusts, and friendships that we call 'community'" (113-4). These faiths, trusts and friendships are not established between authentic, autonomous individuals but among sovereigns who are master enough of themselves that they do not need to recognize themselves in this or that story about their democratic potential but are ready to become other, to think or represent or describe the world "without making any simple truth claims" (114). Under the conditions of sovereign democracy, aesthetic democracy happens as the event in which individuals make an exception of themselves out of their love for the other.

This is a challenging book. Its Eurocentric vision presents an interesting and refreshing alternative to the manifest destiny of democracy on the American plan. What is lost in the final chapter by downplaying Rorty's and Whitman's observations about the promise of democracy in the United States is gained back in insights about a potential for democracy to be drawn from the relation of Europe to its colonial others. The call for a being toward love of the other in a European voice may sound, today, against the backdrop of the nascent nationalism gripping Europe, more like a plea than a plan, and those looking for wisdom about transforming the beleaguered state of politics in the world may be disappointed to find the hope for change modeled on our relationship with literature and not our relations with flesh and blood comrades in arms. Still, Docherty is not recommending that we plan the event of emergent democracy by reading books. He is recommending, rather, that we draw on our openness to becoming other, to seeing ourselves as someone we are not, that is characteristic of our encounter with literature, as an inspiration for making ourselves something other than we are in our encounters with flesh and blood others.

How far this is practicable or even feasible is not clear, however. On what Michel Foucault might describe as the micro-political level, the level of my own self-formation, my being toward love of the other, and a willingness to become other than myself in my amiability toward the other, may prove productive. On a macro-political stage, however, this seems like little more than a dream, a wish waiting to be fulfilled. It is a pleasant dream, and for those willing to lose themselves in the labyrinthine thread of texts and authors Docherty effortlessly and elegantly weaves through this book, it is a dream from which they may not wish to wake. Those who like their theory saddled to practical political intent, though, will find this text frustrating and a disappointment, as frustrating and disappointing as is the current state of democratic theory and practice.