Aesthetic Essays

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Malcolm Budd, Aesthetic Essays, Oxford UP, 2008, 282pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199556175.

Reviewed by Stephen Davies, University of Auckland



This important collection by the prominent aesthetician Malcolm Budd brings together fourteen papers on the nature of aesthetic judgment and value, expression and movement in music, and depiction. In addition, there is a masterly analysis and exposition of Kant’s account of the pure judgment of taste (Chapter Five) and another of Wittgenstein’s view of aesthetics (Chapter Thirteen). Most of the papers are only slightly modified or supplemented, but two are combined in a chapter on musical understanding. Related chapters complement each other nicely without excessive overlap.

Typically, Budd approaches his topics by subjecting the views of two or three philosophers to close, critical examination. His most frequent and sympathetically treated adversary is Frank Sibley, with Richard Wollheim and Roger Scruton also prominent. Where Budd develops a positive view, it emerges through this process and is defended as avoiding the problems he diagnoses in the alternative theses.

Budd holds that for any aesthetic property of an item no set of non-aesthetic properties is both necessary and sufficient for the item’s possession of the aesthetic property, but he rejects the conclusion frequently drawn from this that there can be no aesthetic principles of the form "if s possesses determinable non-aesthetic property N, it possesses aesthetic merit-constituting property A." He also rejects both the principle that judgments of aesthetic value must be based on first-hand experience and the related view that we can know an item’s aesthetic properties only by perceiving them. What distinguishes the recipient of claims about an item’s aesthetic character from the person who correctly makes them on the basis of direct experience is the latter’s appreciation of how the properties in question are realized in the particular item. Because most aesthetic properties are response dependent, the content of aesthetic judgments of an item is such that the evaluative response integral to the property is the appropriate response to the item, and such judgments are true if any competing response reveals a defect in the judger or his engagement with the item.

Aesthetic pleasure is a non-propositional pleasure taken in the apparent relation between an item’s elements or in its higher-order properties where these are directly detectable as realized in the item. As such, aesthetic pleasure is not directed to simple sensory qualities or to higher-order relational properties that take the percipient beyond the item’s sensory boundaries. Because the artistic properties of works of art are of this latter kind, they should be distinguished from aesthetic properties.

The aim of art is to enrich the world through the creation of an object the appreciative experience of which is uniquely valuable. Artistic value is non-instrumental value intrinsic to a work. Fine art is the achievement of intrinsic value in a medium and appreciation of artists’ artistry is an integral part of the experience offered by a work. However, there is no precise metric for artistic value, because there are many different kinds of quality that can make a work intrinsically rewarding or that can detract from its being so. Where there is no determinate answer to the question of whether one work is better than another, there is room for blameless aesthetic preferences.

While Budd is plainly not a pure formalist and allows the relevance of contextual factors and of the artist’s achievement to figure in the appreciation of art, his account retains a Kantian flavor; for instance, he holds that simples, such as pure colors or tones, cannot be sources of aesthetic pleasure or appreciation and stresses the non-instrumentality of value in art. By contrast, many contemporary philosophers would deny that aesthetic pleasure is taken only in the relations between an item’s elements or the features that emerge from their interaction, and thereby they would reject the presupposition that objects of aesthetic pleasure must always possess a degree of complexity. Also, there is a trend to claim that the proximal senses (of taste, smell, touch) can provide aesthetic experience and, in connection with this, to expand the notion of the aesthetic to encompass everyday objects and experiences. Meanwhile, insistence on the intrinsic value of art might be thought to be at odds with the functional purposiveness of most art throughout history. The manner in which many non-art artifacts serve their primary functions can itself be a crucial source of aesthetic interest and satisfaction. If we were to acknowledge the functionality of all art, accepting that some kinds of art have the function of being contemplated for their own sake while allowing that different kinds are directed to educative or other ends, we could provide an account unifying the aesthetic interest of art with the aesthetic interest of other humanly made items, as the Kantian view does not.

Of special interest in the philosophy of music is the nature and role of descriptions of music as involving spatial motion and emotional expression. Such descriptions are frequently taken to be metaphoric. Budd does not necessarily agree. He appeals instead to Wittgenstein’s idea of secondary senses, these being senses that retain the word’s literal meaning outside its home domain but that cannot, unlike metaphors, be replaced by non-synonymous terms. Nevertheless his primary concern is not with this terminological issue.

Sibley claims that metaphoric descriptions of music necessarily are involved in characterizing music with understanding. Yet he also allows that equally apt alternative descriptions are always available and he does not demonstrate the connection invoked by the metaphor between the extra-musical concepts of the word’s home domain and the music’s character, so his claim of necessity is unproved. Scruton also regards metaphor as central to musical experience, with metaphors of spatial motion being ineliminable from the experience of melody, rhythm, and harmony. Budd responds that we often refer to timbre with metaphorical descriptions, but reference to extra-auditory phenomena is not essential to hearing the timbral quality that is described. The same applies to metaphors of spatial movement and to Scruton’s claim that these are necessarily implicated in hearing a melody in a sequence of tones. Budd’s alternative suggestion is that melody is experienced as a temporal Gestalt of elements on a non-spatial continuum. Similarly, rhythm can be explained without reference to dance and the notion of metaphor. Again, chords need not be experienced as spatially separated simultaneous sounds; they are notes falling on a non-spatial pitch continuum.

I share Budd’s view that Scruton fails to unpack the metaphors to which he appeals or to demonstrate their necessity, and I agree that melodies and the like are better described in terms of temporal process than as individuals in motion, but I am not sure we can fully describe the experience of simultaneous, differently pitched notes in non-spatial terms. Crucial here is the universal human recognition of octaves as the same or equivalent notes at a different location, usually characterized as higher or lower.

Scruton also insists that music cannot be literally sad, since it is non-sentient, yet he holds that the metaphoric use of the term is essential to an account of the musical quality. What is more, understanding the metaphorical application of the term to music must be guided by an understanding of its literal, non-musical meaning. As Budd rightly points out, however, the musical quality might differ from the literal one, while being connected with it in a way that licenses the extension of the term to the musical case. (Others have argued, for instance, that the comportment of music can match human behaviors that present an expressive appearance, even when they are not giving expression to a felt emotion.)

Turning to pictorial depiction, Budd challenges Wollheim’s account in terms of the experience of seeing-in, which involves simultaneous awareness of the picture’s marked surface and of the represented subject. This dual awareness certainly occurs, but it does not explain depiction, Budd argues. Wollheim fails to give any account of the second component of seeing-in.

Of the alternatives, Budd favors a resemblance-based account, despite Nelson Goodman’s famous objection that one picture resembles another more closely than either resemble what they depict. The resemblance that is crucial for depiction is the one between the appearance of the picture and the visual field that perceivers would have seen had they regarded what is represented from a certain point of view, their visual fields being the aspect of the way the world is represented to then by their visual experiences when apparent distance is subtracted from their visual worlds. The picture’s viewer sees the picture’s marked surface as isomorphic with the structure of the visual field of the picture’s subject when seen from the point of view from which it is depicted. As a result, the viewer experiences the picture’s subject as in the picture. As this makes clear, we can recognize what is depicted only if we know how it would look face-to-face. If we know or work out that the picture depicts an X, we can learn what an X looks like, but otherwise, though we may see an X we do not see that one is depicted.

Of course Budd accepts that resemblance is not sufficient for pictorial depiction; also necessary is the artist’s intention or, as in some photography, the causal mechanism that connects the image to the appearance of its subject. He also allows that a picture can include visual details not present in the visual field that would be presented by its represented subject and that many details of that visual field might be missing from the picture. But in perceiving the isomorphism between the marked surface and the visual field that would be presented by its depicted subject, the perceiver need not and does not take the additional features to belong to the subject or the missing ones to be absent from the subject. Because of this latter aspect of the perceiver’s experience, pictures may represent their subjects as indeterminate with respect to some of their visual characteristics.

Against the objection that this account inappropriately privileges pictures that preserve perspective, Budd responds that we can see what is depicted under other modes of projection, though we then see the form of the object as distorted. I have doubts about this last claim; it is not obvious that those who work with isometric projections experience them as distorting their subjects. More importantly, it is only sometimes correct to say that we can see what is depicted under a novel mode of projection. It is easy to invent modes of projection that, when applied, preserve the informational content of a representational picture (in that the process can be reversed to retrieve that content), but that generate visual arrays in which no subject, or none that resembles the original, can be seen. In the analysis of depiction, it might be important to work out which modes of projection in addition to vanishing-point perspective make the subject recognizable and which do not. This, however, is a task for which Budd’s account is not suited.

Staying with pictures, Budd reviews and rejects Wollheim’s theory of expressiveness (which is supposed to apply to nature as well as to pictures), according to which expression involves both correspondence and projection. More specifically, there is a correspondence between some features of the work and some psychological state that leads the viewer to recognize the work as the sort of thing one would make if one were feeling the emotion because the work intimates a history of its origin, either how the kind of experience it exemplifies comes about or its own origin in complex perception. Budd argues that it is false that this intimation of origin is characteristic of expressive perception and that without it Wollheim’s account, which can no longer marry the ideas of correspondence and projection, becomes too thin to be enlightening.

Philosophers of art will admire the unfussy care and insight with which Budd probes these intriguing topics, many of which lie at the “abstract heart of aesthetics”, as he rightly observes. I strongly recommend this book.