Aesthetic Experience

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Richard Shusterman and Adele Tomlin (eds.), Aesthetic Experience, Routledge, 2008, 196pp., $115.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415378321.

Reviewed by Robert Stecker, Central Michigan University


This collection of eleven essays on aesthetic experience presents a wide variety of approaches to the topic: historical and cross-cultural, Anglo-American and continental, analytic and pragmatist, phenomenological and post-modernist. This has the virtue of providing a great breadth of views, and, consequently, something of interest for everyone. The admirable intention is to create a conversation about the aesthetic among these different schools of thought. However, the problem is that this same feature leaves many of the essays disconnected from each other, reducing the coherence of the volume as a whole. As it turns out, it is easier to find meaningful debate within a school of thought rather than across schools. I will return to this issue later.

The volume is divided into three parts. Part I is about the nature of the aesthetic. Malcolm Budd, with typical subtlety, notes that the challenge here is (a) to deal with the fact that there are numerous distinct conceptions of the aesthetic no one of which is right, and (b) to spell out one's overall concept, which requires defining a set of inter-related sub-concepts -- aesthetic value, aesthetic judgment, aesthetic property and aesthetic. Budd's proposal makes aesthetic value the basic aesthetic concept. A positive aesthetic value of an item, according to Budd, derives from a relation among its elements, or a higher order property that it possesses, which is capable of yielding pleasure to a person who perceives or "imaginatively realizes" it. With this established Budd easily defines the other three sub-concepts just mentioned. Interestingly, one sub-concept that Budd studiously avoids is aesthetic experience.

An alternative to Budd's account is offered by Gary Iseminger who considers his an experiential account of the aesthetic. But his position, too, has nothing in it that is literally (recognized as) aesthetic experience. Rather, Iseminger is concerned with the aesthetic state of mind, which consists in finding an experience of a state of affairs that is valuable in itself. An experience is a non-inferential way of knowing something. It may, but need not, involve the perception of the state of affairs. So far, Iseminger's position is close to Budd's. The judgment that an experience is good in itself need not be based on its being pleasurable -- one way that Iseminger parts company with Budd (or at least the Budd of this volume). Iseminger's definition of the aesthetic state of mind is set out on the first page of his essay (and in much greater detail in his book, The Aesthetic Function of Art). The remainder of the piece is a reply to criticisms of the definition and to various theses from his book.

In the book, Budd and Iseminger represent the "analytic" camp, and Paul Crowther and Christoph Menke the broadly 'continental' tradition, each trying to elaborate the nature of the aesthetic. Crowther's conception of aesthetic experience is grounded in Kant's idea of the free play of the imagination and understanding in the perception of objects leading to an experience of beauty when object and faculties cooperate. Crowther's more original contribution comes in his discussion of the aesthetic experience of art, which begins, if I understand him, with the experience of the artist captured and conveyed in the artwork. When an audience discovers the artwork it comes imbued with the experience or vision of the artist but is somewhat autonomous from the actual creator of the work. That permits us -- the audience of the work -- "to discover things about ourselves and our own values." (41) Christoph Menke is more concerned with the nature of the discipline of aesthetics than the nature of the aesthetic. But somehow a conception of aesthetic experience as self reflection is supposed to emerge from this discussion, though whether this is the experience of art, nature, and so on, or that of doing philosophical aesthetics, wasn’t clear to me.

Part II is about the scope of aesthetic experience -- both the objects and the activities it ranges over. The most ambitious piece in this section is Richard Shusterman's. Like Budd, Shusterman recognizes that there are multiple conceptions of the aesthetic no one of which is right. Unlike Budd, Shusterman wants to somehow work with all, or at least many, of these conceptions under a pluralistic or disjunctive account of aesthetic experience. If Budd's problem is to explain his choice of one conception, Shusterman's would seem to be explaining the coherence of working with so many. This is not, however, an issue he tackles here. Rather he concludes by arguing that some sexual experiences are also aesthetic experiences, a claim made easier to justify by the multiplicity of experiences that, according to him, count as aesthetic.

Although Martin Seel's essay is entitled "The Scope of Aesthetic Experience", what he actually seems to be pursuing is an account of what aesthetic experience is. His answer: it is a certain type of intensification of perception broadly construed. As with Kant and Crowther, for him this involves a kind of indeterminateness of content in the experience or, as Seel puts it, aesthetic experience "allows what is indeterminate in the determinate … to become evident." (105)

Kathleen Higgins' useful essay is about the role emotion, in particular refined emotion, can play in aesthetic experience. She distinguishes several ways in which emotion can be "refined" and then explores how these conceptions are fleshed out and put to use in Indian and Japanese aesthetics.

Carolyn Korsmeyer explores the aesthetics of food, a topic about which she has written extensively. Kant, and we with him, are tempted to think of food "merely" as a source of sensuous pleasure, and for this very reason rather than an apt object for serious aesthetic judgment, one for the expression of like and dislike. As in her other writings, Korsmeyer wants to oppose this tendency. She argues that to maximize the pleasure we get from food, judgments of taste must have significant cognitive content about the qualities of the food. Further, food is not just a source of pleasure but has considerable symbolic value. Foods have a variety of meanings as cultural artifacts and a full appreciation of food is only possible when this is recognized.

Part III, though graced with its own subtitle, returns to the topic of Part I: the nature of aesthetic experience. One exception is the piece by Jean-Pierre Cometti which is about the role of ontology in philosophical aesthetics, a topic rather distant from the theme of this volume.

The other two pieces, by Noel Carroll and Alex Neill, belong squarely within the turf of Part I. Carroll offers a spirited argument against traditional conceptions of aesthetic experience as a kind of disinterested pleasure or as a state of mind valuable in itself. He also argues against what he calls the aesthetic theory of art: the view that we can both define art and explain its value in terms of the aesthetic experience it is intended to provide. The glue that holds these critiques together is the system of fine arts that arose in the eighteenth century and continued to evolve in the nineteenth. Both the traditional conception of aesthetic experience and the aesthetic theory of art play a role in giving this system apparent coherence. The aesthetic theory of art tells us that each of the fine arts has an aesthetic essence and the traditional conception of aesthetic experience tells us something about what that essence consists in. If Carroll's critique is accurate, then we have to rethink both our notions of art and the aesthetic.

Alex Neill compares Schopenhauer's conception of the aesthetic with the dominant eighteenth century view and its twentieth century descendents. Standard interpretations of Schopenhauer claim his view is continuous with (indeed a species of) eighteenth and twentieth century empiricist views that identify such experience with that resulting from disinterested contemplation of the surface properties of objects. Neill's interesting and original proposal is that this is a misunderstanding. Unlike these other views in which the locus of aesthetic experience is the spectator, Neill claims that for Schopenhauer the artist's experience is central. Disinterested attention to individual ideas is the artist's way of knowing, and the art that is the product of this experience gives spectators access to this especially liberating form of knowledge.

In their very different ways, Carroll through his critique and Neill (through his reinterpretation of Schopenhauer provide an interesting challenge to the ideas about aesthetic experience proposed by Budd and Iseminger. At least in so-called analytic aesthetics, this debate is at the heart of a large and still growing new literature. It's good that the debate -- yet to be resolved -- between these views (as well as those explored by Shusterman) is contained here, but it is a pity that it is given no recognition, much less salience, by the editors. An unsuspecting reader might completely miss it. For this reviewer, it was the most rewarding feature of the volume.