Aesthetic Reason and Imaginative Freedom: Friedrich Schiller and Philosophy

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María del Rosario Acosta López and Jeffrey L. Powell (eds.), Aesthetic Reason and Imaginative Freedom: Friedrich Schiller and Philosophy, SUNY Press, 2018, 217pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781438472195.

Reviewed by Antonino Falduto, University of St Andrews/Martin-Luther-Universität Halle-Wittenberg


This collection provides an analysis of different aspects of Friedrich Schiller's treatment of politics and aesthetics and ingeniously makes an attempt to elucidate the important connection between these two fields in the context of Schiller's work. It has a brief introduction, twelve essays and an overview of the secondary literature on Schiller's philosophical thought. The essays are divided into two sections: the first is dedicated to the relevance of Schiller's work in the context of history of philosophy; the second is characterized by a more theoretical approach, which tends in particular to compare Schiller's texts with the results of some current philosophical debates.

The volume does not deal with Schiller as a philosopher in a more general sense. It focuses, rather, on aesthetics and its relation to politic. The collection represents a very good mix of historical scholarship and theoretical, or rather comparative, application. Some of the leading scholars in the discussion about Schiller's philosophical relevance are contributors.

Part II, "Imagining Schiller Today", moves away from historico-philosophical analysis in order to "revisit Schiller's aesthetical-political proposal from a philosophical perspective, and to put it in dialogue with contemporary approaches and criticisms to the question of the relationship between aesthetics and politics" (p. 6). In "Naïve and Sentimental Character: Schiller's Poetic Phenomenology", Daniel Dahlstrom compares Schiller and contemporary phenomenology (in particular Husserl). Jacques Rancière debates on "Schiller and the Aesthetic Promise" with references, among others, to Adorno and Lyotard. Christoph Menke gets back to Rancière himself in "On the Fate of Aesthetic Education: Rancière, Posa, and The Police". Menke illustrates two objections to the concept of aesthetic education, questions Rancière's theses against postmodern aesthetic theory, and rethinks the relationship between art and politics. Jeffrey L. Powell reflects on "Kant, Schiller, and Aesthetic Transformation" through an interesting juxtaposition of Schiller and Walter Benjamin, while María Luciana Cadahia, in "Aesthetic Dispositfs and Sensible Forms of Emancipation", finds a way of integrating Schiller with contemporary authors (Foucault, Deleuze, Agamben, Esposito).

I will discuss Part I in some detail in order to present a more precise picture of the historico-philosophical way its authors worked.

In the section's first essay, "Schiller, Rousseau, and the Aesthetic Education of Man", Yvonne Nilges analyses the relationship between Rousseau and Schiller. According to Nilges, "to this day little is known about Schiller's reception of Rousseau" (p. 11), and it seems that the whole first part of the volume tries to bridge this gap in the scholarship. In her article, Nilges opposes Rousseau's ideas on society, state, and in particular on direct democracy, to Schiller's idea of a tribunal of reason. She erroneously claims that the term "tribunal of reason" descends from Kant's ethics. Nonetheless the expression "Gerichtshof der Vernunft" is not a strictly moral philosophical one, but rather a juridical metaphor which Kant himself widely used in the Critique of Pure Reason in the context of theoretical philosophy.[1] This inaccuracy notwithstanding, Nilges presents an interesting clash between the one-sidedness of Rousseau's theory of the state as an inanimate object, and hence insensible and cold, as he presents it in the Social Contract, and Schiller's completion of Rousseau's image of the state with the recourse to sensitivity. In this way, instead of an enlightened education, which promulgates only rationalistic principles, Schiller's education of humanity is presented as holistic, addressing both reason and the heart through the cultivation of "a sense of human totality" (p. 14). By approximating Schiller to Hegel's philosophy of right, Nilges presents the overcoming of the differentiation between private individual and political citizen in order not to loosen the totality of the human being, but rather to reach its integrity. The harmonious reconciliation is described as due to art and aesthetics, which become "an end in themselves" and bring the individual to acquire a "sense of balance and totality" in its innerness, thanks to the fact that "the will of society and the will of the individual" become one (p. 19). In Nilges' analysis, the contrast between the two views on state becomes apparent despite the presence of an implicit reference to Rousseau's work in Schiller's Aesthetic Letters.

In "Schiller on Emotions: Problems of (In)Consistency in His Ethics", Laura Anna Macor focuses on Schiller's moral theory in order to show how his "assessment of both the limitations and the usefulness of emotions in moral life" is consistent with "Kant's assessments of virtue, taste, and the joyful fulfilment of duty" and by pointing out in this way the "connection between duty and nature" (p. 24). Macor underlines that "from Schiller's point of view, the moral agent must accomplish her actions because of their intrinsic goodness, i.e. because they respond to the moral law".  (pp. 26-27). Nevertheless, she also addresses Schiller's interest in the education of the emotions in the context of the improvement of morality, which can "supplement of Kant's pure moral theory insofar as it refers to the moral agent" (p. 29). By referring to the well-known Samaritan example from the Kallias Letters, Macor suggests that, for what concerns the education of the emotions, not the single moral action, but rather the character of the moral agent is at stake, when she is performing "the same action with or without pleasure without damaging its purely moral nature" (p. 31). From this, Macor implies the necessity of cultivating the emotions, which is due to the human being's final purpose that "lies precisely in becoming a moral being" (ibid.). Macor's analysis represents a valuable contribution given the recent renaissance of scholarship on Schiller's moral thought. This is so even though her conclusion that "Schiller's account of moral agency can be seen as an entirely new approach in the history of ethics" (p. 33) seems to underestimate the holistic account of agency that can already be found, among others, in Aristotle's works connected to the idea of flourishing and of virtue as cultivation of character and dispositions.

It is particularly difficult to summarize and comment on Manfred Frank's quite dense (and well worth reading) "Schiller's Aesthetics between Kant and Schelling". Frank offers a variety of profound insights into the history of philosophy, starting from Schiller's debts to Kant and pre-Kantian philosophy and moving on (after reference to, among others, Reinhold, Hölderlin, Novalis, and Fichte) to the similarities between Schiller's and Schelling's philosophical approaches. Frank begins with the reason Kant defends a clear division between sensibility and understanding by assessing that a monism of sense and understanding would have led him to a position not withstanding a critique of pure reason. He describes Kant's critique of Leibniz and Wolff, among others, who are mentioned also as authors shaping Schiller's "enthusiasm for the inner connection between sense and understanding, spirit and nature" (p. 39), before dealing with Kant's third Critique, which tried to close the abyss between the two faculties thanks to the power of imagination that "can present pure freedom only indirectly in accordance with an analogy brought to light by reflection" (p. 41).

In Frank's analysis, this shows how "the conceptual inexhaustibility of the beautiful becomes a symbol for the unpresentability according to intuition and the effusiveness of freedom" (ibid.). The present theoretical difficulty gave rise to Schiller's aesthetic reflections. Schiller aimed at overcoming the subjectivity of Kant's aesthetics through an "objective grounding of the phenomenon of beautiful" (p. 42). Frank shows how Schiller believed that a "primordial agreement between nature and reason" (p. 44) can help us to overcome the mentioned difficulty, and that "beauty transcends the capacity of the faculty of cognition and can only experience its grounding from the side of practical reason" (p. 45): in aesthetic satisfaction, we re-cognize our soul, which "seeks and finds itself in the experience of the beautiful" (p. 48). And this experience, which is a "self-enriching self-externalization", corresponds to love. Frank's interpretation of Schiller's text is accurate and intriguing. The way in which he proposes to overcome Kant's faculty dualism through Schiller, his clear exposition of Schiller's project, his description of Schiller's aesthetics as the attempt to find the common root of reality and ideality, all bring us to the conclusion that Schiller's and Schelling's positions are closer than commonly believed (Schelling even preceded Schiller in assuming "an absolute identity of the real and the ideal, of nature and of spirit", p. 53). Still, according to Frank, Schelling's absolute is not a suitable solution for the overcoming of the aforementioned dualisms, as the doubts of many of Reinhold's students, in particular Novalis, showed. Frank's delineations of the critique against Schelling's identity-philosophy complete this way an article, which makes of Schiller a philosopher much closer to our contemporary debates. Frank's essay deserves the attention beyond the circle of Schiller scholars.

In "The Violence of Reason: Schiller and Hegel on the French Revolution", María del Rosario Acosta López, proposes a comparative reading of Schiller's and Hegel's works. She has an ambitious aim: to explain the overall importance of the whole collection by achieving the "reinstatement of Friedrich Schiller as a philosophically relevant thinker" (p. 59). One might question whether this aim is still a genuine desideratum and if Schiller's philosophical importance has not already been widely recognized in the last years, thanks to works such as the one by Beiser and many others. Nevertheless, Acosta López's enterprise deserves a closer look, since her political interests lead her to try to link contemporary conceptual frameworks and the history of philosophy in order to find "a contemporary path for modern thought and the Enlightenment project" (p. 60).

The main risk of the Enlightenment project considered by Acosta López consists in reason's trying to transcend its limits and leading to dogmatism. From this, a violence of reason follows, as the French Revolution has shown. According to Acosta López, however, both Schiller and Hegel recognize the problem of dogmatism of reason, when they "illustrate the risks entailed precisely when thought ceases to be revolutionary [ . . . , i.e.] when thought ceases to move and truly engage with reality" (p. 61). This way of arguing implies a neutral theoretical distance, which Acosta López seems to find in both the Aesthetic Letters and in the Phenomenology of Spirit, where philosophical activity is linked to historicity. One main focus of these books can be found, according to her, in their critical consideration of Rousseau's concept of general will, which, in its abstraction from individuality, has been transformed into annihilating violence when "a mode of consciousness absolutely convinced of the legitimacy of its ideal necessarily entails the imperative of its step into praxis" (p. 73). Acosta López presents how the violence of the French Revolution necessarily had to follow as "the last stage of the experience undertaken by Rousseauian Enlightened project" (p. 75) and how both Schiller and Hegel recognized it. The aim she set at the beginning of her contribution, i.e. the reconciliation of modern and contemporary philosophical paths, might have been too ambitious, so that a proper answer to the initial question of intertwining the two seems to be missing. Still, the essay is a well-founded, interesting reading of a central political topic of the Enlightenment.

The last essay is dedicated to "Schiller and Pessimism". Frederick Beiser, who certainly is the most influential initiator of the renaissance of the philosophical inquiries on Schiller in English-speaking countries in the last decades, questions the plausibility of interpreting Schiller's poetry as pessimistic, as did Julius Bahnsen. Bahnsen's interpretation was based on a possible similarity between Schiller's and Schopenhauer's thought. In The World as Will and Representation, Schopenhauer outlines his theory on tragedy by underlining that "the pleasure we derive from tragedy" comes from an "elevation above all the goals and goods of life, this turning away from life and its enticements" (p. 85). Schopenhauer repeatedly quoted Schiller's verse "as evidence for his pessimistic view of the world" (p. 86). In order to prove this claim, Beiser starts by analysing Schiller's early optimistic views, which Schiller himself doubted in later years (this is clearly the case in the Aesthetic Letters). Still, Beiser notes that denying optimism does not entail being a pessimist. He successfully shows, through analysis of Schiller's plays, that Schiller's tragedy, against Schopenhauer's view, does not only aim at arousing pity, but also gives "the spectator an awareness of his power to act upon and change the world" (p. 93). Beiser believes that Schiller's conviction can be conclusively referred to as: "the world can be made a better place" (p. 96). And this happens when affirming the human power of freedom -- which Schopenhauer instead wanted to deny us.

To conclude, this collection consists of fourteen valuable articles on Schiller, both in a historico-philosophical and in a theoretical perspective. As a whole, the volume provides a well-informed treatment of both aesthetical and political conceptions that are to be found in Schiller's work as well as indications of how Schiller's thought at times differs from that of his and our contemporaries, while it could at times also support contemporary philosophical paths.

[1]  On this topic, see the recent book by Diego Kosbiau Trevisan, Der Gerichtshof der Vernunft. Eine historische und systematische Untersuchung über die juridischen Metaphern der Kritik der reinen Vernunft. Würzburg 2018.