Aesthetic Testimony: an Optimistic Approach

Aesthetic Testimony

Jon Robson, Aesthetic Testimony: an Optimistic Approach, Oxford University Press, 2022, 176pp., $84.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780192862952.

Reviewed by Robert Hopkins, New York University


Recent decades have seen considerable growth in philosophical interest in testimony as a source of knowledge. While discussion has centered on explaining how testimony can play that role, lively debates have arisen in the wings about how widely testimony’s legitimacy ranges. Some have argued that testimony is not a legitimate source of moral, religious, or even mathematical belief; others that a similar prohibition applies in aesthetic matters. It is this last question to which this brisk and clearly written volume, the first book on the topic, is devoted.

Is it acceptable to form a belief about the excellence of a movie, the beauty of a vase, or the emotional power of a novel simply on the basis of someone else’s say-so? Those who say No, pessimists about aesthetic testimony, divide into two camps. Unavailability pessimists claim that testimony fails to make knowledge available to its recipient. For some reason or other, aesthetic propositions such as those above are not ones it is possible to learn from others’ asserting them. Unusability pessimists instead locate the difficulty outside the epistemic sphere. Aesthetic testimony can, under the right conditions, transmit knowledge; but some other norm, not itself epistemic in character, stands in the way of our taking up what we are offered. The problem is not that knowledge is not available to be acquired, but that it is not legitimate to make use of that opportunity.

Jon Robson sets himself against both camps, adopting full-throated optimism. He helpfully characterizes his opponents, whichever camp they belong to, as holding two asymmetry theses: They hold that testimony is a problematic route to aesthetic belief, and that in this it contrasts both with taking testimony on most other topics and with forming aesthetic belief by engaging with the relevant object oneself. It is sufficient to be an optimist, in Robson’s terms, that one reject either asymmetry. His optimism is full-throated in rejecting both.

After a useful discussion of how to frame the various positions (chapter 1), Robson next argues against various moves that seek to derive pessimism from definitions of aesthetic judgement, or from an expressivist account of its semantics and psychological underpinnings (chapter 2). The meat of the argument then unfolds in three parts. First, Robson argues that optimism should be our default view, and thus that the burden of proof lies on his opponents (chapter 3). Second, he discusses a range of cases intended to elicit intuitions supporting one side or the other, seeking to persuade us that optimism can accommodate even cases that seem very much to favour the pessimist (chapters 4 and 5); but that the converse is not true. Third, he devotes his last two chapters (6 and 7) to a related range of cases sometimes thought to support pessimism. If you tell me that the latest Mission Impossible movie is gripping, there is something very awkward in my simply asserting as much, without any acknowledgement that I’ve yet to see it myself. The focus here, assertion, is at one remove from the question central to the debate between pessimists and optimists, which concerns belief. Nonetheless, as Robson notes, pessimists might seek to explain the awkwardness. The task he shoulders is to develop an explanation the optimist can use, and to argue that it performs better than the pessimist alternative.

The book has many interesting contributions to make, but here I concentrate on three.

The first is Robson’s attempt to argue against certain forms of pessimism by appeal to the very nature of belief. (This is part of his argument that we should be optimists by default.) He directs this part of his case against pessimists who hold both (AB) that aesthetic belief is indeed a form of belief, and (AN) that it is governed by an additional norm specific to the aesthetic case. Belief, Robson claims, is constitutively governed by some general norm, the most obvious candidates being the norm of truth (believe what is true) or knowledge (believe what you are in a position to know). This governance is such that meeting that norm is both necessary and sufficient for it to be permissible for one to believe the relevant proposition. But then, where the belief in question concerns some aesthetic matter, either there is no room for any further norm (contra AN), or the state that norm governs is not belief (contra AB) (Chapter 3, sections 7–8).

The structure of this argument arouses suspicion. Consider any kind of thing K defined by certain necessary and sufficient conditions C. It is surely possible for some sub-kind KS to be subject to further conditions CS. For something to be a K it is sufficient that it meets C, for it to be a KS, it must also meet the further conditions CS. This structure is perfectly coherent, and indeed we encounter it often. What about the specific instance Robson has in mind renders things otherwise? (Does it, for instance, make a difference that the conditions are themselves norms?) At one point Robson is at least circling this objection (72–3), but his discussion doesn’t quite confront it, and to my mind nothing he says shows where it goes wrong.

The second contribution I will discuss is Robson’s appeal to contextualism, and his use of it to reconcile optimism with some of the cases that fuel its pessimist rivals. Contextualists claim that the epistemic standard a belief must meet to count as knowledge varies across those making the knowledge attribution. They thus distinguish ‘subject factors’, those factors determining how good an epistemic position the putative knower is in from ‘attributor factors’, those factors determining how good her position has to be for any belief she forms to count as knowledge (Robson, 90, citing DeRose 1992). Robson’s suggestion is that the optimist can appeal to contextualism in order to explain why in various cases it seems questionable to form aesthetic belief on the basis of testimony.

Robson gives four such cases, each taken from authors with pessimist leanings (80). However, he only works the ideas through with one case, taken from Alan Hazlett:

Your friend knows a lot about art. You want to know whether the Rothko Chapel is a masterpiece. So you ask her, and she tells you that the Rothko Chapel is a masterpiece, and you believe on that basis that it is. (Hazlett 2017, 49)

We are invited to think that the deliberator’s belief here is in some way illicit, and this is an invitation Robson accepts. But why is the belief defective, if not because some form of pessimism is true?

Robson’s contextualist answer is, broadly, that the context of attribution renders the bar for knowledge too high for Hazlett’s protagonist to meet it. How so, exactly? Robson’s explanation involves various elements: that the question is of importance to the attributor, that the deliberator has readily available to her ways to settle the matter for herself, and that the testimonial context raises some relevant alternative to the truth of the proposition she is offered (114). The discussion here could usefully proceed a little more carefully. (It is a general feature of the book that its suasive force lies in aggregating, rather than deepening, the various strands of argument Robson and other optimists have presented in various journal papers.) It is not entirely clear that each of these elements is indeed present, what role each is intended to play, or even (with respect to the third) that Robson thinks it does, in the end, have a role. However, two larger worries also loom.

The first is who ‘the attributor’ is supposed to be in the various cases Robson aspires to handle. Is it the deliberator herself, or us theorists, pondering the strangeness of her condition? In discussing the importance of the issue, Robson more than once (94 and 114) appeals to the fact that those who study these philosophical questions are liable to care a lot about aesthetic matters. That seems questionable, but it at least suggests that he is taking the key attributors to be us theorists. Why, however, can we not assess cases such as Hazlett’s by imaginatively inhabiting the perspective of the deliberator? And if we do, why think we must carry across any concern we do have for the aesthetic? If we perform that exercise, do we still think it would be illicit for her to adopt the belief she’s offered? If so, and in particular if we think she should not adopt the belief even if she cares little about such matters, the contextualist explanation loses its grip.

The second worry is that contextualism is first and foremost a doctrine about the attribution of knowledge. While some of the original pessimist cases speak of knowledge, others do not (80). How, then, is Robson to extend his contextualist optimist explanation to those other cases? Is he tacitly assuming one of the norms of belief offered above, that subjects should believe only what they know? Does he think contextualism about knowledge can be extended to cover other epistemic statuses, such as permissible belief? Either way, it would help again to know whether any norms adequate belief must meet here are imposed by the right-thinking subject herself, or by us theorists viewing her from without. Absent answers to these questions, it is hard to judge how successful Robson’s attempt to use contextualism to mop up the problem cases promises to be.

The book’s third contribution lies in its discussion of aesthetic assertions. Why, going back to the example above, is it unhappy for me to assert ‘Mission Impossible is gripping’, simply on the basis of your testimony to that effect? The pessimist will say that one should only assert what one believes, and that your testimony does not provide me with a legitimate source for the relevant belief. The optimist must find an alternative explanation. Robson’s ingenious solution is to appeal to signalling. Various authors have suggested that the practice of creating objects for aesthetic appreciation is to be explained, at least in part, by the fact that it signals that those who undertake it possess various attributes desirable in mating partners. Their aesthetic labour demonstrates that they have the leisure, originality of mind, intelligence, manuals skills, etc., to make a good mate. Robson adapts this idea to the practice of aesthetic appreciation, or at least to that part of it which involves expressing aesthetic judgements by asserting them. Appreciation too is demanding, requiring various admirable qualities of mind and body. (Consider the connoisseur’s eye.) Possession of those qualities can be signalled by asserting the judgements required to form them. Signalling can thus help explain why we make such assertions—that is, it can help explain, if not how the practice developed, then at least why it persists. But this story also requires some block against cheating. If anyone can assert an aesthetic judgement, whether or not it is the product of their own appreciative labour, the value of aesthetic assertion as a guide to appreciative skills will be lost. To avoid this risk, Robson suggests that the practice must be governed by the following norm:

AF: In order to properly assert an aesthetic proposition (P) an agent must possess sufficient warrant for legitimately believing P on the basis of the operation of their own aesthetic faculties. (121)

It is independently plausible that our practice of making aesthetic assertions is governed by AF—it is what renders infelicitous my claim about Mission Impossible. In offering an explanation for why AF holds, Robson can thus also explain the oddness of such claims. And since none of this appeals to pessimism about testimony as a route to aesthetic belief, this ‘Appreciative Signalling Account’ is one the optimist can readily adopt.

Again it would have been helpful to have some of the details of the account spelled out a little further. It is noteworthy that, while Robson does offer an explicit statement of the original signalling account (125), he is less explicit when it comes to his own reapplication of the key ideas (126). And I would have welcomed exploration of some of the apparent differences between the cases of creation and appreciation. If you compose a musical, I can tell that you have the leisure, application, and skills, both musical and lyrical, required to do that, whether or not I am myself in a position to judge that it is any good. But if an acquaintance of ours asserts that the piece is marvellously subtle, does that provide me with any evidence that she has the skills of a capable appreciator? Perhaps she’s just mouthing off, spouting opinions without real grounds for them. I will need some corroborating evidence that her judgement does indeed reflect admirable appreciative qualities. Absent that corroboration, inviting her out for a date would be premature. No doubt even in the creative case the signalling value of the creative act is supported by a wider social framework of corroborating factors. But both explanations would be deepened by comparing the roles of these factors across the two explananda.

Another question one might raise about the Appreciative Signalling Account concerns whether the practice it describes admits of reflective endorsement. Suppose the account is true, and that we come to believe it. Would we, or should we, continue to engage in a practice governed by AF? The original appeal to signalling, like any evolutionary explanation of aspects of our conscious and social lives, involves taking an external perspective on those aspects. There is always the question of how well the lessons of that perspective fit with the view from inside the practice or mental operations it seeks to explain. Robson’s explanation tells us that our practice of aesthetic assertion is governed by AF because that enables such assertions to signal various admirable qualities in the asserter. He is a little vague about quite what value that information might play, but the most obvious idea, given the view’s origins in the signalling account of aesthetic creation, is that it points to qualities that make the asserter a suitable mate. Knowing all this, should we continue to allow AF to govern our practice? Or should we recoil from the hardnosed, somewhat mechanistic, view of ourselves and our lives that all such evolutionary thinking invites us to adopt? Perhaps what we would do and what we should do come apart. Perhaps the latter has no clear answer. Still, it would be nice to know.

I raise these questions, both about Robson’s account of aesthetic assertion and about the other two contributions I noted, in the spirit of interested engagement. This is a fine book, bringing together the now extensive literature on its topic in a judicious and stimulating discussion. It certainly presents the definitive defence of optimism about aesthetic testimony. Just as importantly, it offers lessons for those with other concerns too—not just Robson’s direct opponents, pessimists about aesthetic testimony; but pessimists in other areas too, and those interested in norms of assertion, independently of questions about means to legitimate belief. Although readers should brace themselves for an egregious number of errors in copy editing, on every other count they will find this book a rewarding read.


K. DeRose (1992), ‘Contextualism and Knowledge Attributions’, Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 52: 913–29.

Alan Hazlett (2017), ‘Towards Social Accounts of Testimonial Asymmetries’ Nous 51: 49–73.