Aesthetics and Architecture

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Edward Winters, Aesthetics and Architecture, Continuum, 2007, 179pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 0826486320.

Reviewed by Karsten Harries, Yale University


In 1999 Richard Hill published his Designs and their Consequences: Architecture and Aesthetics (Yale University Press, 1999). As its similar title suggests, Winters' book, part of the Continuum Aesthetics Series, invites comparison with Hill's earlier effort. Common to both is the attempt to use analytic aesthetics to help answer the question: What is Architecture? Winters, to be sure, appears unfamiliar with the work of his precursor, as he seems unfamiliar with much of the literature relevant to his subject. Hill deplored the fact that while architects in recent years have shown an extraordinary interest in philosophy, analytic aesthetics has been largely ignored. An exception is Roger Scruton's The Aesthetics of Architecture (Princeton University Press, 1980) and, as Hill was explicit about his indebtedness to Scruton, so is Winters. Unfortunately Winters' book is not likely to generate a great deal of interest in analytical aesthetics among architects and those interested in architecture: missing is the kind of informed engagement with particular works of architecture that might have brought the all too often overly sketchy considerations advanced by the author to come to life. Nor is someone familiar with aesthetics likely to find much in this book's fourteen brief chapters that will hold his interest: the discussion remains too introductory and sketchy.

The definition of architecture given by Immanuel Kant in his Critique of Judgment provides Winters with his point of departure:

Architecture is the art of exhibiting concepts of things that are possible only through art, things whose form does not have nature as its determining basis but instead has a chosen purpose, and of doing so in order to carry out that aim and yet also with aesthetic purposiveness. In architecture the main concern is what use is to be made of the artistic object, and this use is a condition to which the aesthetic ideas are confined. (p. 1)

Put somewhat more narrowly, works of architecture are useful buildings that succeed also as aesthetic objects. Such an understanding lets Winters question the "vastly overrated works" of Zaha Hadid and Daniel Libeskind" (pp. 3, 103). Architecture should not be confused with sculpture! But what is architecture? The first three chapters explore in very cursory fashion the answers given to that question by Classicism, Modernism, and Functionalism, where limiting the focus on just these three invites questioning.

Classical architecture, according to Winters, "consists in a number of orders, each with its own internal regulatory system" (p. 15). Architecture here is "seen as imitative of the process of building" (p. 17). Classicism's ancestry can be traced from Vitruvius "through Alberti, William Chambers and more lately to Demitri Porphyrios" (p. 17). Not surprisingly Winters rejects claims that would place Classicism so understood "at the very heart of architecture" (p. 24): there is just too much architecture that resists such a limited understanding of its essence.

Modernism is said to be heir of the Enlightenment, which would replace the light of heaven with the light of reason (p. 25). Once again Winters turns to Kant. Most of the brief modernism chapter is indeed given to a very "rudimentary sketch of the structure of the thought of one of the greatest philosophers of the West" (p. 30). Unfortunately this sketch does not have much to tell us about architecture. Kant, as discussed in this book, does not cast much light on why in modernism "each art has begun to turn its attention to the means by which it is constructed" and turned away from naturalism to formalism (p. 34). Kant does insist that reason cannot provide art with binding rules. Clement Greenberg, rightly accused by Winters of having misunderstood Kant by failing to acknowledge that Kant understood painting as a representational medium, is said to have provided us with "the starkest expression of one version of the aesthetics of modernism," where Winters mentions Mies van der Rohe's Barcelona Pavilion as its architectural counterpart (p. 38). Winters is well aware that those modernist artists who celebrated the rationalism that is part of our Enlightenment heritage were challenged, e.g. by Dada and Surrealism. But neither was able to generate a convincing approach to architecture. At the end of this discussion the reader is left wondering just what answer Winter thinks modernism gave to the question: What is architecture? Architectural modernism is allowed to remain vaguely defined. Winters himself remarks that in this chapter he "had little to say about modernism in architecture." His explanation: "this is in part because we shall move on to functionalism in the next chapter, where that is to be conceived as one major driving force behind modernist architecture" (p. 37).

Difficult to divorce from modernism, functionalism would have us experience the aesthetic component that transforms a mere building into a work of architecture as essentially related to its purpose (p. 38). As Viollet-le-Duc put it, architecture "must be true in respect of the programme, and true in respect of the constructive processes" (p. 40). An obvious difficulty is that, single-mindedly pursued, such truth threatens to lose sight of beauty; another is that we are unable to state with precision the function of a house. Winters raises an important question when he points out that there are many uses to which even a bedroom, which would seem to have an obvious function, can be put, that in many cases the function remains too open to allow us to demand "truth in respect of programme."

It hardly required an additional chapter to show that classicism, modernism, and functionalism, as discussed in these three short chapters, all fail to provide an adequate answer to the question: What is architecture? Disappointingly, the first part of his book, "The Theory of Architecture," leaves the reader with little more of substance than what is suggested by Kant's sparse remarks on the subject.

Theorizing has become a prominent part of our architecture world. "Part II: Theory in Architecture" thus begins by looking at the way structuralism has entered architectural practice. "The intellectualization of architecture along the lines informed by structuralism has" indeed "been widespread" (p. 75). But Winters' sketchy rehearsal of Saussure, Lévi-Strauss, and Barthes casts little light on architecture, hardly surprising given the author's conviction that "At the level of theoretical discourse there is not much to be said in favour of structuralism and semiology" (p. 75). And his discussion of Post-Structuralism has a similar destructive aim. "It is only by removing the power of these highblown theories that we can look afresh at the nature of the arts in general and consider more coolly how we might best profit from them" (p. 83). Jacques Derrida and Umberto Eco, Peter Eisenman and Bernard Tschumi are dismissed without a serious attempt to confront what so many young architects and theorists have found challenging in their work. Nelson Goodman, "the American philosopher who has most rigorously attempted to apply semiotics to the understanding of art" (p. 84), is given a more sympathetic reception. But even his "clear, precise, and intelligible" (p. 88) theory, according to which "a work of architecture is a building plus reference" (p. 87) -- where buildings can be said to refer in different ways, e.g. to things in the world, such as sailboats (The Sydney Opera House), or by exemplifying their structures, or perhaps by exemplifying "freedom from the earth, which in turn expresses spirituality" (p. 88) -- is found unsatisfactory: the experience of art forces the author to "forego the claim of the theoretician that language provides a suitable model with which to compare our understanding of art" (p. 89).

The concluding chapters of this second part turn to the public realm. Somewhat surprising is the emphasis given to the Situationist International in this very short book -- though, to be sure, it did have some influence on architectural thinking and modern culture. Repetitive, even while much too cursory, "Chapter 9, Architecture as Public Art," includes a sympathetic discussion of Maya Lin's Vietnam Veterans Memorial as operating "at an architectural level as public art" (p. 106) that gives us some idea in what direction Winters would like architecture to develop. From this example we are said to learn that architecture has the power to frame our lives and embed our values and beliefs" (p. 106), a sentiment I can only endorse, having used the same example to support a related point in my The Ethical Function of Architecture (MIT Press, 1997).

With "Part III: Architecture in Mind" Winters turns to the philosophy of mind to advance a discussion that, as he admits, so far has not gotten us very far. "Chapter 10, The Mind and Its Furniture: A Philosophical Response to Theory" thus seeks both to underscore the already stated "shortcomings of the linguistic views" and to "provide a platform upon which to build a positive account for architectural understanding." Architecture here has pretty much disappeared from the discussion, while the author's foray into the philosophy of mind, his account of perceptions as made up of sensations and propositional attitudes, while suggestive, remains too undeveloped to even begin to meet the twofold goal stated in the beginning of the chapter.

In "Chapter 11, Architecture, Mind, and Language" Winters touches on much of the material discussed in preceding chapters. Thus he returns to structuralism and post-structuralism, which are criticized for having "failed to give due weight to the experiential feature of our apprehension of meaning in architecture and the arts more broadly" (p. 130). I cannot disagree with this claim. I only wish it had been developed. And once again Winters finds Goodman more adequate, even appropriating Goodman's reconstructive relativism, which before he had called "irredeemably vague" (p. 90), turning to Wittgenstein to remedy what he finds lacking. But Winters' revision of Goodman remains itself too sketchy to advance our understanding of what it is to experience or interpret a work of architecture.

In the following chapter Winters raises the questions: "can architectural significance include the representational? And can it include the expressive?" (p. 140). Thinking of buildings such as a hamburger-stand made to look like a giant hamburger, Winters observes that representation so understood gets in the way of architecture because "it gets in the way of thinking of the building as a building." But so understood representation also gets in the way of our appreciation of a sculpture as a sculpture, of a painting as a painting. That representation need not be so understood and that it can help to illuminate works of architecture I attempted to show at some length in my The Ethical Function of Architecture.

Having rejected an understanding of architecture as an art of representation, Winters turns to architecture as an art of expression, comparable perhaps to music. But architecture is said not to possess "the same expressive range as music" (p. 143). When a Gothic cathedral is said to sing, this metaphor should not be taken to mean that it expresses an emotion, but that it "alludes to a certain attitude that we should take up toward the building once we inhabit its spaces" (p. 144). Architecture is thus said to possess the same facility of allusion possessed by the other arts (p. 145).

More interesting, but similarly underdeveloped, is the suggestion that "I can come to regard architectural features as framing the activities with which others pursue their lives" (p. 146). Following Roger Scruton and invoking Wittgenstein, another of his heroes, Winters characterizes architecture as "the art which most naturally encapsulates what has been called a 'form of life'" (p. 149). In a building we "see in it a certain form of life … In appreciating the building I project a form of life into it" (p. 156). The form of life Winters would like to see encapsulated in architecture I can only applaud: in conclusion the reader is offered a house owned and designed by Jeremy Till and Sarah Wigglesworth as an example of "a work of architecture … as important as any in the contemporary world … built of bails of straw and sand bags, among other things," the house is said to "take the political and moral strand of energy conservation" and to make "a work of architecture in which we take aesthetic pleasure" (p. 161). I welcome this plea for a green architecture.

But the two strands that Winters hopes to have drawn together in this book, "that architecture is to be described as a visual art; and that in appreciating architecture we have to attend to the appearance of its individual works" (p. 162), are all too familiar and a weakness of this book is that there is little evidence in it of the demanded attention. The forays into the philosophy of mind remain too undeveloped and too removed from architecture to expand our understanding of architecture either as building or as art.