Aesthetics and Literature

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David Davies, Aesthetics and Literature, Continuum, 2007, 212pp., $26.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780826496126.

Reviewed by Eileen John, University of Warwick


David Davies here offers a succinct, intelligent account of the state of play in a range of philosophical debates concerning literature, focusing on the Anglo-American tradition. The book considers conceptual and ontological questions (what is literature, what is fiction, what is a literary work, what is a fictional character), questions about interpretation (how to construe discourse concerning fiction, how intentions and context constrain interpretation of literary works), issues arising from emotional engagement with fiction (whether it is genuine emotion, how we can enjoy works of tragedy and of horror), and questions concerning the cognitive and ethical roles and values of literature. If you do not know these debates, this book would be an excellent, efficient route to wide-ranging understanding of the field. If you are familiar with these debates, I think it is well worth following Davies in his forthright examination of the issues. The book is not aimed at promoting Davies' views on the issues, and chapters typically leave the reader with a summary of the possibilities considered -- where one might go from here -- but the possibilities have been well canvassed for plausibility, and a number of interesting approaches are advanced along the way. With a few exceptions, I felt persuaded by Davies' way of framing, and assessing the promise of, the various views and strategies under consideration. I will sketch some problems and questions for further exploration below.

In defining literature, Davies takes his goal to be to understand the notion of the literary artwork. Drawing on ideas of Nelson Goodman, he views art-making as involving the intentional 'articulation of content by means of a vehicle', where that articulation relies on 'shared understandings that enable content to be articulated in distinctive ways' (13). In the case of literature, these shared understandings call for us to attend closely to a verbal text with an eye to appreciating its overarching point, exemplified features, and complex range of reference. A literary artwork is intended to be approached as replete and dense with meaning. This view would presumably fall afoul of the idea that "A poem should not mean / But be" (MacLeish, "Ars Poetica"), as in Sontag's critique of our meaning-seeking habits of response to art. But I would think that for most of us this broad notion -- that in literature people exercise their capacities to make and experience objects as richly meaningful -- has strong appeal. I will sketch two questions about the application of this view.

First, it would be good to hear more about the bearing of this account on the evaluation of literature. I assume that Davies wants this to capture the structure, as it were, of how a literary work aims to function, but does not offer it as prescriptive about good ways of serving this function. I wasn't sure if some evaluative norms fall out of the view nonetheless. Can works that do not exploit the rich meaning-making potential of texts be fully successful as literature (e.g., poems that aim for experiential immediacy and not allusive depth, or stories that aim for a single, stark meaning)?

Second, I wanted to hear more about a question that Davies raises himself, concerning how this view applies to standard works of fiction. Davies early on rejects the idea that having fictional content is either necessary or sufficient for being literature, noting that lyric poetry, for instance, seems to be nonfictional (5). He illustrates his account of the literary artwork with examples from poetry (in which attention to complexity of meaning, and to the point of finely individuated uses of language, is clearly called for), and says that the question of how the view applies to works of fiction such as novels and plays will be developed implicitly in later discussions (16). Now, on the one hand, it seems obvious that works of fiction can be intended to articulate content in complex ways, so there is no need for Davies to pursue this explicitly. But on the other hand the textual vehicle of fiction can be strikingly submerged, as if it is not the object of close attention but rather the imagined world it allows us to experience. Are works of fiction that have that kind of 'transparent' presence for us to that extent less literary?

A broader question about the relation between literature and fiction arises as well. The majority of the book concerns fiction, and this focus on fiction is appropriate, given that it accurately reflects the focus of the philosophical debates that Davies is considering. But if fiction is not conceptually essential to or paradigmatic of literature, and yet works of fiction are in practice literary paradigms, this leaves a question (addressed variously in the work of, e.g., Robert Stecker, and Peter Lamarque and Stein Haugom Olsen) about what kind of centrality fiction should have within the literary domain. And further, the focus on fiction that Davies inherits makes one want to understand better how philosophers' concerns with fiction relate to and illuminate our interests in literary art. These concerns clearly can be driven primarily by interests in the ontological and semantic puzzlingness of fiction, without worrying about literary relevance, but I took Davies' approach to be that the ontological and semantic puzzles actually do matter to understanding literary art and would like to hear Davies develop that approach more explicitly.

On the topic of fiction, here are a few examples of Davies' treatment of the issues that struck me as persuasive or helpfully provocative. Davies surveys a complex history of attempts to understand what fictional characters are, so as to make sense of the diverse things we think and say about them (e.g., that Huck Finn learned to read the river -- 'fictional discourse', and that Huck Finn is a forebear of Holden Caulfield -- 'discourse about fiction'). Davies concludes that we are unlikely to get a single account of fictional characters that will simultaneously make sense of fictional discourse and discourse about fiction. It seems fictional characters both have a claim on us as entities that belong within their fictional worlds and as entities created by authors and possessing features they do not have within their fictional worlds. Davies leaves us to speculate on this state of affairs -- what are we left with, if we have to give different accounts of fictional characters, to make sense of these different types of thought and discourse? Are there principled 'bridges' between the two practices?

Somewhat similarly, Davies gives a brief but thoughtful resolution of tricky questions concerning how we determine what is true in a fiction. He argues that apparently more basic interpretive facts about what is true at the level of story often cannot be determined prior to establishing richer and more global interpretive matters concerning the point and central themes of a work (this is a point that helps suggest how Davies' account of literary art applies to fiction). We might have to understand whether a novel aims for a certain kind of cultural criticism, say, in order to tell whether or not its characters and narrator understand certain facts about their world. I think this considerably complicates models of 'truth in fiction', if, in the case of fiction, the 'world' in question is not necessarily what makes things 'true'. It seems we cannot smoothly transfer practices for establishing actual truth into the realm of fiction, if warranted claims about fictional worlds need to spring from a further level of reflection and interpretation. Davies' result then is quite interesting and potentially disruptive.

One claim that I found unpersuasive concerned the nature of fiction. Davies argues that a work that accurately tracks actual events, and is known to do so by the author, can be a work of fiction as long as the author's story-telling purposes override the 'fidelity constraint' that governs nonfiction -- if my goal is to tell a story, and my life story happens to meet my needs as a storyteller, I can offer it as a work of fiction. I do not think we should relinquish the 'made-up' aspect of fiction so readily. In this case Greg Currie's requirement that a fictional narrative, if true, be accidentally true, better captures my intuitions. Davies more generally argues for the importance of the performance represented in the process of making art, and the 'making it up' aspect of the performance seems crucial to literary fiction.

Finally, let me highlight Davies' treatment of the cognitive value of literature. He makes a very interesting case for literature as a source of categorial understanding and knowledge of general principles. He presents an account of learning from thought experiments in science and extends that account to literary experience. His 'moderate inflationism' about thought experiments modifies the assumption that thought experiments provide no new empirical information. The modified view is that by getting us to construct 'mental models', thought experiments trigger exercise of tacit knowledge: we gain access to unarticulated cognitive resources that allow us to manipulate accepted data in new ways and thus generate new results. Davies cautions that these results are only as reliable as the unarticulated cognitive resources that the reader brings to the literary 'experiment' -- if I bring distorted background assumptions to bear on my reading, then I may get a reassuring but false sense of 'learning' from compatibly distorted works of literature. Two quick, somewhat more inflationary responses to this: the work of literature can articulate some of these resources, and I think that in the best cases that articulation, and the consequent ability to scrutinize and criticize factors affecting our judgment and reasoning, are central to the learning experience. I think the work ought to help articulate these resources, and if it does not, then we are stuck saying that there is some kind of 'black box' of resources that luckily can be drawn on. The murkier response is that in the case of literary thought experiments, the nature of the 'data' offers great potential for inflection, salience, perspective, and evaluative judgment, and that seems to allow for more 'newness' in what is presented than Davies' model may acknowledge. Suppose a work presents me with a familiar social scene in such a way that I see different features as salient or take up different psychological perspectives on it, and I see the worth of experiencing it in this way as I had not before. This seems like a fairly common literary experience, and I'm not sure how to describe it in Davies' terms. Can I say that the work presents me with new data? Or is old data presented but my tacit resources allow me to process that data differently? The former, more inflationary thought seems more plausible to me. At any rate, I found this aspect of the book to be quite stimulating and ripe for fruitful complication.

Without trying to summarize the full range of material covered in the book, I will just reiterate that Davies displays an impressive grasp of this field. The book would be a very useful interlocutor in a class studying the philosophical texts Davies considers. In general, the solid argumentative content puts readers in a position to follow through substantively on the issues, and it makes one hope that Davies himself will pursue some of these issues further.