Aesthetics and Morality

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Elisabeth Schellekens, Aesthetics and Morality, Continuum, 2007, 162pp., $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780826485243.
Mount Holyoke College

Reviewed by James Harold, Mount Holyoke College


Aesthetics and Morality belongs to a class of books whose intended audience is difficult to describe. The back cover tells us that it is meant not just for students, but also for "anyone with an interest in philosophy and the arts". I take this to mean that it is supposed to be the sort of book that a curious person, lacking any formal training in philosophy, could pick up at an art museum gift shop and read with enjoyment. So, unlike many classroom textbooks, it does not aim for comprehensiveness and systematicity, and unlike more scholarly works, references are scant (and gathered at the end), and argumentative detail is omitted or minimized.

Schellekens guides the reader through some of the central problems in philosophical aesthetics in an interesting and original way by focusing on what looks like just one particular topic. Schellekens uses Wittgenstein's claim that "Aesthetics and Ethics are one and the same" as a starting point for an exploration of a whole range of questions in philosophical aesthetics. As she argues in Chapter 1, "It is, in other words, in contrasts and comparisons that the beginning of a satisfactory answer into [sic] the question of what the aesthetic really is can be found" (28). Schellekens' title is therefore a bit deceptive: the book is not so much about the relationship between aesthetics and ethics (though it is about that too) as it is about what that relationship can tell us about aesthetics. As such, Aesthetics and Morality offers a refreshing alternative to more traditional introductions to aesthetics, which march the reader from topic to topic without any common thread to tie them together. The book is short (just 145 pages), and while it leaves many things out, it does a good job of giving the reader a sense of the range of issues and positions. However, the writing is stilted in places, and there are a number of errors that should have been corrected in copy editing. These weaknesses make the book less readable than it otherwise might be.

Topics as varying as Kant's view that beauty is a symbol of morality, the notion of the aesthetic attitude, Sibley's account of aesthetic concepts, and aesthetic cognitivism are all covered, but not in the order one would expect. The movement from one topic to the next is not motivated by a historical timeline but by association with philosophical issues raised in the previous topics. As such the outline is organic and the flow from one topic to the next quite natural. (This might be a disadvantage if one were to pick up the book just in order to see what Schellekens has to say about one particular topic -- one wouldn't know what chapter to consult. Thankfully the book has a fine index.) While it would be too strong to say that the book pursues a clear line of argument, the theme of the book and its central questions guide the reader nicely.

On the whole, the author's treatment of the topics is accurate and clear. While she does not try to represent anything like all of the main positions on the topics she covers, Schellekens usually does a nice job of picking figures and positions that are important and representative. The quality of her coverage of historical figures is uneven: she seems very much at home with the moderns (her discussion of Kant is particularly nice), but she sometimes stumbles with the ancients, as when she says that techne is "one of the main terms for 'art' in Ancient Greek" (15).

The chief problem with Schellekens' book has to do with bias. Authors writing such texts need to decide whether to put forth their own arguments, thus inviting readers to challenge them, or to create an air of neutrality, so as to allow readers to draw their own conclusions about the subject. Most of the best and most interesting general audience books do the former: in aesthetics, these include Peter Kivy's Introduction to a Philosophy of Music and Matthew Kieran's Revealing Art. Schellekens' book is caught between these two possibilities. On the one hand, at the end of each chapter she draws some conclusions, which are often quite substantive and controversial; on the other hand, these conclusions are often sketchy, and not enough is said to support them or explore their implications.

A couple of examples will illustrate. In Chapter 4, Schellekens gives a very nice overview of autonomism and moralism (and some variants), offering brief critical objections to each. For example, she raises the cases of Perry's vases and Riefenstahl's Triumph of the Will as objections to the separation of aesthetic and moral assessment, and claims that "it is very difficult for the Autonomist or Aestheticist to retain their credibility in the light of works with such morally reprehensible character" (74). Such cases are indeed difficult for autonomism/aestheticism, but she says nothing about how one might try to respond to these objections, nor does she say how some philosophers have in fact tried to do so. By the end of Chapter 5, Schellekens dismisses all of the systematic theories positing a regular relationship between ethical and aesthetic assessment. She then goes on to suggest that we need "a new framework that overcomes the limitations of the debate and provides us with a fresh spectrum of philosophical alternatives" (91). One then expects Schellekens to outline such a fresh start for us, but nothing is offered. The result is frustrating. Schellekens' critical assessments of the available views are not as strong or charitable as they should be, but one could forgive that, if Schellekens herself had outlined a new approach and showed its promise.

The second example is similar. Throughout the book, Schellekens consistently pursues a kind of anti-theoretical approach. Schellekens writes in the introduction, "a neat, catch-all theory is unlikely ever to emerge … one of the sources of richness of this area of investigation is precisely the resistance to overly blunt theorizing" (9). At the very end of the book, Schellekens returns to Kant's discussion of beauty as a symbol of morality, and notes the similarity between the open-endedness of aesthetic judgment and the moral imagination. She concludes that "it seems almost a matter of taste" (145) whether we conclude that there is a deep metaphysical, perhaps Platonic, connection between morality and aesthetics, or whether we adopt a "pragmatic" view, according to which no such metaphysical claim can be established. It is one thing to advocate skepticism about "overly blunt" theories, and another to say that the only ground for choosing between these two views is taste itself. Schellekens does not do enough to justify the latter claim. It's clear that one of her aims in the book is to show readers the complexities of the subject, but one fears that readers might instead conclude that there is little point in worrying about such trivialities.

Almost all of the work on aesthetics and ethics has been done by philosophers whose main area of expertise is aesthetics. Discussions of whether or not aesthetic value could be thought of as a distinct, autonomous area of value tend to be rich, thoughtful, and carefully done; parallel discussions about moral value tend to be thin and rather unimaginative. Schellekens' book is no exception. She includes a very nice description of aesthetic cognitivism, but, as most aestheticians do, she entirely neglects the problem of moral cognitivism. In fact, most writers in aesthetics simply assume that it makes good sense to speak of moral knowledge, although in ethics, the question of whether moral attitudes are cognitive or affective is highly vexed. In short, discussions of aesthetics and morality tend to be rather unbalanced, giving the reader the impression that aesthetics is the difficult member of the pair. Schellekens nicely points out that aesthetics is easier to define and understand in contrast to and comparison with morality than it is when considered by itself. What she and most philosophers who write on this subject neglect is the possibility that our understanding of morality could also benefit from the comparative approach. It is, perhaps, outside the scope of Aesthetics and Morality to address this issue, since Schellekens' book is clearly intended to introduce readers to issues in aesthetics, not in ethics. But this feature, which works as a strength of Schellekens' book in some respects, reflects a weakness in the field.