Aesthetics and Nature

Placeholder book cover

Glenn Parsons, Aesthetics and Nature, Continuum, 2008, 164pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780826496768.

Reviewed by Mara Miller, Independent Scholar



Glenn Parsons’s concise book, Aesthetics and Nature, is a clear, well-written, tightly reasoned introduction, following the methods and principles of analytic philosophy, to a number of arguments regarding the aesthetic dimensions of nature, particularly those pertaining to nature’s beauty, as a justification for the preservation of wilderness. In most cases, Parsons analyzes the ethical and practical implications of the arguments, referring consistently to science-based arguments, to analogies between aesthetic experiences of nature and art, and to issues of quantification as touchstones. At the forefront is “a concern that has run throughout much of our discussion in this book: the connection between aesthetic appreciation and our ethical relationships with the natural world” (p. 128). To his credit, he confronts the ethical complexities head-on, while giving neither ethics nor aesthetics prima facie priority. The book also does justice to the practical arguments, and especially to consideration of the ways in which aesthetic arguments work to counter practical ones when pure rationality does not. His analyses of pros and cons of various positions repeatedly reference both the analogy of nature to art, and aesthetics based on scientific knowledge and appreciation. He also addresses issues of quantification at several points.

But while seemingly exhaustive, and in spite of its title, Aesthetics and Nature is culturally specific. The disregard of any vantage point other than analytic philosophy is, at this stage of the game, irresponsible in a book that does not announce itself as such — in any book published in the last quarter century — and one that purports to be a general aesthetics of nature. It colors everything, including discussions that are clearly intended to be fair (although the treatments of approaches outside analytic philosophy read at times like deliberate misreadings — see below). Many novice readers will immediately turn away in disappointment, feeling excluded, when they realize that once again they can find no toehold that would link their experience to this philosophical account. In addition, of course, openness to other approaches would deepen any analysis.

According to the Introduction, the study is motivated by the need, prompted by the environmental movement, to understand our aesthetic experiences of nature. This is important because our aesthetic experience of nature plays a large part in determining the places we single out for preservation, and indeed whether to conserve or preserve them in the first place. (Parsons introduces J. Passmore’s 1974 distinction between Conservation and Preservation, in Chapter 7, “Aesthetics and the Preservation of Nature”, setting conservation aside from further consideration.) His meticulous reasoning and determined follow-through of the various paths of criticism and support will be of enormous benefit to those who present the case on behalf of environmental preservation.

In the context of the environmental movement, aesthetics is one of several competing claims, and natural beauty only one way of defending it. In the brief Introduction and Chapters 1 and 2 Parsons clarifies concepts of nature, beauty, natural beauty, wilderness, the aesthetic, and aesthetic qualities and experience, all often used for defense of nature and the environment. (He neglects to clarify the concepts “landscape” and “environment”.) He distinguishes among various kinds of interaction with nature. This section also includes a short history of taste in landscape. Parsons proposes as a working definition for natural beauty “a certain kind of perceptual appearance possessed by what takes place or comes into being without the agency of human beings” (p. 6). He presents criticisms and defenses of “natural beauty”, appropriately historicized (along with related modern notions of the picturesque and the sublime), ultimately settling on the more philosophically justifiable notion of “aesthetic quality” defined as “any kind of pleasing visual or auditory appearance” in nature (p. 11, 15, modified pp. 15-16).

Parsons then explains the work of the philosopher:

to discover what conception of nature’s aesthetic qualities we ought to hold … by trying to formulate, in very general terms, what the concept of “aesthetic quality” means … in other words, to formulate a philosophical definition of what exactly having aesthetic qualities consists in (p. 12).

He defines philosophical definitions as those that "capture the essence of the concept" and “break down the concept … into simpler notions, thereby revealing its nature” (italics in the original). Such an approach, while limiting the philosopher’s job unnecessarily, clarifies his working assumptions and makes the book valuable to novices to philosophy as well as to the topic — although it may also distort the novice’s understanding of what philosophy can do.

Chapter 2 analyzes the role of thought and the presentation of arguments from post-Modernism, which Parsons unfortunately misleadingly equates with Relativism. The titles of Parsons’ subsequent three chapters and final two chapters are self-explanatory. “Formalism”, “Science and Nature Aesthetics”, and “Pluralism” analyze the main arguments within each approach to aesthetics as they apply to nature, while the final two chapters, “Nature in the Garden” and “Art in Nature”, address issues regarding the aesthetic analysis of nature in those two specific contexts. Chapter 6 addresses embodiment, physical distance, sensory aspects, and the Aesthetics of Engagement.

Parsons provides a number of illuminating and enjoyable examples, and for the most part makes good use of previous analyses, although a number of authors whom one would expect to be treated at some length, such as Malcolm Budd (The Aesthetic Appreciation of Nature), are given a cursory treatment focused on a single position, often not their most important. Throughout, his modus operandi is the presentation of important variants of the several positions, along with the major arguments pro and con, and the criticisms of the pros and cons, with frequent reference to their ethical and/or practical implications, repeated references to arguments comparing nature with art, and incisive judgments as to what is defensible and what is not at each level of the analysis — admirable features in an introductory text (and useful for the rest of us too). A major principle in the presentation of the arguments is the sorting out of conflicting claims of aesthetics, ethics, and practicality/expediency, which for the most part he accomplishes admirably.

Aesthetics and Nature is part of the Continuum Aesthetics series edited by Derek Matravers, a series designed to be “stimulating, engaging and accessible”, while “offer[ing] food for thought not only for students of aesthetics, but also for anyone with an interest in philosophy and the arts”. This it does. Parsons discusses a wide range of arguments within the text and provides a valuable bibliography of work in analytic philosophy. It is a daunting task, less because the literature on the topic is so vast than because it is so intimately dependent on other branches of philosophy that cannot be fully discussed in an introduction.

But the series’ goal — to offer food for thought — may have placed a serious unrecognized constraint, even to the point of over-riding philosophical responsibilities. Others in the series are as much as ninety pages longer, and Parsons’ discussion would have benefited from the extra length (1) to address, even if only briefly, a number of issues related to his topic: tourism, architecture (a topic on which Parsons has written), the body — all burgeoning fields in which the aesthetics of nature is hugely important; (2) to report the contributions of some seminal thinkers — from Kant to the post-Modernists, Budd and Berleant — more responsibly; and (3) to acknowledge other types of “inherent value” (which, after all, on many accounts defines the “aesthetic”), such as religious or sacred value (also a major contributor toward aesthetic perception of nature), historic value, and the relationship of landscape and environment to cultural identity. Parsons has published extensively on aesthetics and ethics regarding nature in general, art, and animals. The book would have been strengthened, however, had he taken better advantage of his own areas of expertise.

Equally significant, there are grievous omissions of important points of view, particularly of Continental philosophy and phenomenology, not to mention all non-Western philosophy. (Although Parsons discusses Zen briefly, his reference to “the Zen Buddhist conception that all things are inherently impermanent” as the source of the “Japanese interest in natural things that express transience” is in error [p. 11]. That Japanese interest, while enhanced and even guided by Zen once Zen arrived in Japan, began centuries earlier, while impermanence as a fundamental principle is not limited to Zen but is common to all Buddhism.) It is, moreover, precisely the readers of an introductory volume such as this one who are most in need of guidance as to the boundaries (or lack thereof) and implications of the core material.

No author can do everything, and Parsons explicitly adopts analytic philosophy as his orientation at the beginning. But Parsons is familiar with Continental philosophy and phenomenology, to the point of having reviewed books (JAAC vol. 66, no. 3, summer 2008), and indications of their projects and approaches would have been valuable, while their lack makes the title misleading, and leaves his arguments open to surprising weaknesses. In his quantification arguments, for instance (p. 107 and elsewhere), he neglects the irreplaceability of (many) landscapes as a criterion for preservation, and ignores the possibility that practical and economic advantages accruing from wilderness destruction might be achieved by other means. Both are crucial issues in environmental preservation.

His slighting of work in philosophy of the body and his focus on the distal senses (sight, hearing) at the expense of the proximal senses (touch, smell, taste), recapitulates the object-based aesthetics with a museum orientation that most nature and environmental aesthetics — along with contemporary museum practices and arguably art itself — have been at work to expand over the last several decades, and proves problematic overall especially for his discussions of the Aesthetics of Engagement. This is particularly puzzling given Parsons’ work on contemporary art. But in general his discussion of differences between distal and proximal senses suggests he has not thought through the implications. He does not use these terms, and his reliance on the outdated “lower senses” betrays his bias.

Worse, while engaging, the book often mischaracterizes movements with which the author does not agree, notably post-Modernism and the Aesthetics of Engagement. Important alternative positions both in support and in criticism are omitted, which the reader is less likely to notice because the book is not written in defense of a single point of view (and the novice reader is particularly unprepared to identify). The characterization of post-Modernism, although commonly encountered in its critics, is not recognizable from its proponents’ writing. Parsons sees post-Modernism as an extreme form of relativism: “Anything goes”. But the idea that there may be more than one truth does not entail that everything is true, or all versions are defensible. Does anyone actually espouse such a version of relativism — outside of our students in their very first humanities classes?

There is an analogous problem with the Aesthetics of Engagement, which neither demands unity with the object, event or environment with which one engages (as Parsons claims), nor requires the abandonment of thought, as a quick perusal of Arnold Berleant’s oeuvre attests. Although this field was developed by Berleant — whom Parsons credits — Parsons’s criticisms are based primarily on Cheryl Foster’s work, while Berleant’s development of the fuller implications for nature aesthetics is ignored. I believe he misses the force of Berleant’s work because Parsons is insensitive generally to issues of relationship and process, in any context in which they come up (passim but especially Chapters 8 and 9) — a peculiarity in environmentalism.

In short, Parsons’s analyses of subfields, authors and texts that are not confined entirely within the analytic tradition often miss the point. These include work such as the aesthetics of the everyday, based largely on Saito’s Everyday Aesthetics, and my own book The Garden as an Art (in Chapter 8: Nature in the Garden). He omits, for example, my use of (and arguments for) the broader, systemic, relational, and/or process features of the environment (sun, air) as both natural materials and artistic elements that must be considered in a philosophical analysis of gardens both as gardens and as artworks — a course of reasoning that would have opened up the discussion of “nature” and brought it within the scope of scientific environmentalism. He rightly notes the familiar criticism of “institutional” definitions of art (that they are circular), but drops the issue, without reference to theories that might resolve the problems. In spite of its importance for his last two chapters (and his own published familiarity with the issues), he does not pursue it either in his own critical reflections or in literature review. Standard arguments, such as the argument that the institutional definition of art cannot account for the inclusion of new kinds of artworks, or for our need to define as art some works from cultures that didn’t have “art” institutions (or didn’t have them at the time the works were made — which includes most pre-modern Western works), as well as my arguments for concluding that gardens can be an artform, are never mentioned in spite of their pertinence. (Although we reached different conclusions — germane to the discussion — both Stephanie Ross, in What Gardens Mean, and I felt we had to address the question of why gardens ceased to be considered works of art after being so considered during the 18th century.)

This is surprising in someone who co-authored with Allen Carlson a book on art (Functional Beauty, Oxford UP, 2008). At times it seems Parsons slights anything related to his own publication strengths. (The bibliography also omits several important works of his.) This is too bad, since a discussion of the aesthetics value of animals — another topic he has written on — would almost have to lead him to a more systemic understanding of environment (unless the discussion is restricted to animals in zoos — and old-fashioned zoos at that).

This is related to a further problem, also a function of an object-based, as opposed to relational, approach (or one that includes proximal-sense aesthetics). This is that virtually all discussions seem predicated on identification of isolable parts of landscape or environment, with little acknowledgment of the fundamental insight of environmentalism, namely, the systemic nature of the physical environment.

Another problem is Parsons’ nearly exclusive reliance on “wilderness” as the model for nature — wilderness by definition excludes human beings and therefore the interactional and relational aspects of nature. This skews the fundamental issue of what it means to be alive or to be part of nature: the systemic aspect, the interdependency — and the somatic components as a generally relevant force. (He does bring them in here and there.) The focus on wilderness shifts our attention, without our noticing, from aspects of nature that may be present — and important — in other contexts, but that are not in any sense wilderness: nature in architecture and various kinds of built environment. These are mentioned early on, but do not get the attention they need.

His facile dismissal of questions regarding the extent to which we ourselves are “natural” or part of nature, whether these questions be raised by scientific environmental biology and psychology, or Buddhist, Confucianist, Daoist, Navajo or other traditions, is symptomatic of a larger problem with his conception of nature — and of us, who, as he sees it, remain viewers, users and consumers of nature without being further implicated. Reference to other cultures’ approaches to the topic might have opened the discussion up to proximal senses, relations to nature other than seeing, buying and exploiting and conserving/preserving, as is evident in David E. Cooper’s A Philosophy of Gardens (Oxford UP, 2006) — which may not, however, have been out at the time he was writing. Cooper manages to reason analytically while also using insights and arguments from other traditions. Even more important, he integrates knowledge based on engagement with gardens — called gardening — into his arguments. Insights such as Cooper’s would have deepened the discussions of both Engaged Aesthetics and gardens. Readers will find it a useful addition to Parsons’ garden chapter.

Brief as it is, a book like this needs a comprehensive index. This one omits many terms that are important to Parsons’s analysis: aesthetics of the everyday, animals, heuristic, industrial parks, intrinsic value (and value per se), language, personal identity, picturesque, quantification of value, swamps/bogs/marshes (wetlands is mentioned, but only its main discussion, although the discussion in other places is important), Venice, wilderness. It is not at all clear why some authors and texts are referred to in notes exclusively while others are mentioned in the text — use of Donald Crawford’s concept “aesthetic affront” would seem to be a prime example of one that should be integrated within the text, since the discussion occupies well over a page (p. 130-131) and Parsons has to explain it and its source anyway (in an endnote). Allen Carlson’s dismissal of the capability of environmental art to enhance nature, although germane to the main discussion, is similarly inexplicably relegated to a note (Chapter 9 note 17).

In spite of these theoretical and practical limitations, Glenn Parsons’s Aesthetics and Nature is a useful and interesting introduction to the fields of aesthetics and environmental studies. Ultimately this examination of the aesthetic appreciation of nature and its ethical ramifications in the contexts of wilderness, gardens, and environmental art provides a compelling reason to preserve wilderness, and will prove a useful tool for guiding our decisions regarding the preservation of natural beauty.