Aesthetics as Philosophy of Perception

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Bence Nanay, Aesthetics as Philosophy of Perception, Oxford University Press, 2016, 214pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199658442.

Reviewed by Dustin Stokes, University of Utah


The title of Bence Nanay's monograph is provocative, and partly, but not only, because it is nicely ambiguous.

With regard to 'aesthetics', Nanay resists any sharp delineation of relevant topics, while insisting on a distinction between aesthetics and philosophy of art. So, aesthetics has its roots in studies of beauty but also, and importantly for Nanay's choice of emphases, concerns apparently special ways that we mentally take up objects and events (and not just artworks): experience, attitude, judgment, evaluation, attribution. With regard to 'philosophy of perception', he is again liberal, understanding 'perception' to denote more than just pure sensory experience (supposing that there is such a thing). Accordingly, questions in philosophy of perception concern not just those about senses like vision and audition, but also about imagery, possible top-down and cross-modal effects, and attention.

Nanay carefully emphasizes that there are questions in aesthetics not fully or helpfully answered by doing philosophy of perception, and that not all matters aesthetic are perceptual. Those caveats offered and notwithstanding, he writes "it shouldn't sound surprising that it is a promising avenue of research to consider debates and problems in aesthetics to be really about the branch of philosophy that is about experiences, namely, philosophy of perception" (10). And because Nanay understands the analysanda of philosophy of perception broadly, his strategy is to employ the "conceptual apparatus" of that discipline to offer novel analyses of questions not just about the experiences we count as "aesthetic", but also a range of other related phenomena that traditionally fall under the aesthetic. So, finally to an important disambiguation, the approach of the book is to employ philosophy of perception as a way of doing (some) aesthetics, rather than to employ aesthetics as a way of doing philosophy of perception. The lessons that we are supposed to learn are for theories of aesthetics, gotten by appeal to perception-studies. This is an exciting and surely fruitful approach, with a wide scope of value. Indeed that scope may be even wider than Nanay claims. There are points where the reader may wonder why the opposite direction of explanation is not considered more explicitly.

The book is a model of what in today's academic world we call "accessibility". It is not exclusive to those already steeped in either discipline denoted by the title. In this same spirit, the discussions are rich with examples drawn from both "high art" and "popular" media, never overused and always on point. This is not to suggest that the discussion is "overly accessible": it offers high-level discussion of technical issues in philosophical aesthetics and art theory, and no less so of issues in philosophy of and empirical studies on perception. For each separate topic or chapter, prior to offering his own critiques and positive analyses, Nanay offers a clear and engaging background story -- whether it is the conceptual history of formalism, philosophical theories about how we see pictures, or scientific evidence that suggests sensory perception is not functionally isolated from other mental processes. The book both invites and informs.

With its richness of approach and liberal characterization of controversial concepts, it would be difficult to identify the thesis or the strategy in Aesthetics as Philosophy of Perception (apart from the rather broad one indicated in the title). But there is at least one clear candidate. Nanay's analysis centres largely around an emphasis on perceptual attention. The book thus begins (after the introductory Ch. 1), with an analysis of attention, homing in on a special notion of distributed attention (Ch. 2). Once individuated, Nanay calls this mode of perceptual attention -- attention focused on objects but distributed over properties -- "aesthetic attention". Much of the book is then an application not so much of philosophy of perception (though in many places it is this) but of the philosophy and empirical study of perceptual attention to traditional problems in aesthetics. In that same chapter, the notion of aesthetic attention is applied to the classic and controversy-bogged debate about aesthetic experience, the aesthetic attitude, and disinterestedness. Ch. 3 offers a new model of the perception and appreciation of pictures. Ch. 4 suggests an important amendment to orthodox thinking about aesthetic properties. Ch. 5 offers a weakened version of formalism, allegedly keeping the virtues but avoiding pitfalls of more classical versions of formalism. Ch. 6 addresses questions about the intuitive uniqueness of artworks and aesthetic experience, plus a discussion of the "innocent eye". Relatedly, Ch. 7 analyzes the question whether vision has, in some sense, a history: does human vision or visual processing change over time and with cultural evolution? In each of these chapters, Nanay's notion of aesthetic attention plays a central role in analysis. Only the final chapter, concerning identification with fictional characters, deviates from this mould. But here attention (just of a different kind) still figures large in the discussion. In this respect, an alternative title of the book might be Aesthetics as Philosophy of Attention. And this would make an important virtue of the book more perspicuous: philosophers (aestheticians included) are only beginning to carefully study attention. This is a newly flourishing field of research and one that promises to dramatically enrich theorizing about arts and the aesthetic.

Nanay's analyses of and conclusions about these topics are bold and sometimes surprising; they will certainly spark critical engagement. In what follows, I develop a possible worry about his notion of aesthetic attention, and then briefly characterize what consequence this may have for his broader aesthetic project.

Nanay writes that "in the case of some paradigmatic instances of aesthetic experience, we attend in a distributed and at the same time focused manner: our attention is focused on one perceptual object, but it is distributed among a large number of this object's properties" (13). Empirical psychologists have long distinguished focused from distributed attention. Sharpening these distinctions is elusive. One way to do it is by appeal to the spotlight metaphor: focused attention captures a smaller portion (spotlight) of the visual field, by contrast to cases where more of that field receives attention. Another way is quantitative: focused attention is on one or a few entities while distributed attention is on many entities. Note that these are distinct ways of marking the distinction. A second distinction concerns attention to objects vs attention to properties. 'Objects' here denotes not only the philosopher's concrete particular, but instead, Nanay urges, a "sensory individual": which could be any entity that "we attribute properties to" (61). Thus included as objects in this sense would be concrete particulars, plus events, whole scenes, and groups of objects (say, a still life arrangement). 'Properties' in this usage is the familiar one ('features' is the more common term in the psychology literature). Nanay then derives a corresponding four-part typology. "Attention can be:

i. Distributed with regards to objects and focused with regards to properties

ii. Distributed with regards to objects and distributed with regards to properties

iii. Focused with regards to objects and focused with regards to properties

iv. Focused with regards to objects and distributed with regards to properties" (24).

Examples of ii come easily, insofar as being constantly distracted by features of one's visual array counts as attending. Examples of iii are common whenever one is performing a fairly precise motor movement, for example grasping the coffee cup from one's desk. Nanay wants to argue that cases of i are also common, and include many instances of visual search. And he further wants to distinguish instances of iv as special: these are cases of aesthetic attention. When I attend to the painting or sculpture in the gallery, my attention is focused on that one object while simultaneously distributed across many of its properties. This, Nanay argues, is distinctive and explanatory of many paradigmatic instances of aesthetic experience, as well as other aesthetic phenomena.

What motivates the aesthetic attention thesis? Largely, it seems, intuition. Nanay considers a range of simple cases of perception of art, as well as colourful reflections from writers as diverse as Proust, Camus, and Huxley. And his notion of aesthetic attention does align well with the first person descriptions given of those experiences. He also suggests that because this is a special mode of attention, it will plausibly be "slow to change" after we've left the gallery or theatre. And indeed we do often enjoy this lingering effect after an aesthetic experience with an artwork. As with many other places in the book, Nanay also makes (cautious) appeal to empirical studies. Vogt and Magnussen (2007) found both behavioral and performance differences between novice subjects vs subjects with multiple years of formal artistic training. When free scanning both realistic and abstract images, novices tended to fixate much more on a dominant figure, while trained subjects distributed their fixation across a wider range (and more often) of the image. The trained subjects were also better at recalling formal and structural features of the image than novices.

Let's grant that these considerations are sufficient to motivate type iv as a distinctive way of attending. The critical question is whether instances of iv are especially aesthetic, and depending upon the answer to that question, whether attention of that type can do all of the enlisted explanatory work for aesthetics.

Visual search is clearly an attention-driven mental phenomenon. Consider a pair of well-worn examples. One is traveling, has a red piece of luggage, and is searching a crowded and populated baggage claim area for one's luggage. Or one is searching a Where's Waldo image: a maddeningly complex picture containing a hard-to-find Waldo, who is always typified by a red cap, round spectacles, and red and white striped sweater. Brief reflection, and lots of empirical study, reveals that in these cases the features of interest (e.g. the red things in the baggage claim), across the visual array, "pop-out" at the expense of other irrelevant features (Scolari et al. 2014). Nanay wants to characterize this phenomenon as an instance of i. Why? His claim is that here many objects receive attention but only one property of those objects is attended. But note that this makes important assumptions about objects and properties both: we get this interpretation of the visual search case only if objects are concrete particulars and properties are property-types. But there are alternate ways to treat objects and properties here, partly encouraged by Nanay's own analysis. First, as already mentioned, 'objects' in this theoretical context are "sensory individuals": any entity to which we attribute properties. In this sense, the baggage claim scene and the Waldo image count as objects (Nanay himself counts landscapes to be candidate objects in this sense). And it is on such an object, just like the painting or sculpture, that one's attention is focused. Second, in the visual search context, there may be just one relevant property-type, as Nanay emphasizes, but it will be tokened multiple times in the scene. We attend to property-instances or features (not types) and, accordingly, our attention is distributed across properties. On this interpretation, the visual search task involves attention focused with regards to objects (say, the Where's Waldo image) and distributed with regards to properties (say, instances of redness). If this is right, either attention of type iv is not aesthetic and Nanay has missed the mark, or aesthetic attention is not nearly as special as supposed.

Taking on the second horn of this dilemma is more promising: type iv attention is reasonably called aesthetic, but it is far more widespread than Nanay claims. This is a possible virtue, but may come at some revisionary cost. First an example of a cost specific to his analysis, then the possible virtue.

The first task Nanay sets his notion of aesthetic attention to is to rescue some notion of distinctively aesthetic experience. Aesthetic attention is not Kantian disinterest, but "distributed interest". What then makes aesthetic experience special? One answer is "because aesthetic experiences allow us to see and attend to the world differently: in a way we don't, and couldn't, see it otherwise" (35). So the specialness of (some) aesthetic experience is supposed to derive from the specialness of aesthetic attention. But if the worry expressed above is apt, then aesthetic experience is just far more widespread than anyone, including Nanay, supposes. Common instances of visual search will count as possible instances of aesthetic experience. Other common phenomena where this mode of attention would seem to play a role include cases involving unfamiliar phenomena, and cases of expertise. He discusses the first in relation to formalism (see Ch. 2.5 and Ch. 6); the second is discussed just below.

Here is the possible virtue, predicated on a sketchy hypothesis. There are a number of features common to the wide range of empirical studies on perceptual expertise, and many of them align well with Nanay's type iv attention. Car-experts, bird-experts, expert radiologists, fingerprint examiners, etc., exhibit greater sensitivity to configural, global features of the objects of their expertise. Eye tracking results further suggest a broader distribution of attention to properties of the objects of focus (Bukach et al. 2006; Scott 2011). Finally, it's worth noting, the term 'gestalt' is used regularly in the empirical expertise literature and the philosophical aesthetics literature both. And Nanay's type iv attention would often enough, it seems, enable gestalt recognition, be it of Warblers or Warhols. So perhaps what attention of type iv is distinctive of -- and this would be equally true for the art expert subjects in the mentioned Vogt and Magnussen 2007 study -- is some kind of expertise, grounded in a perceptual domain.

Suppose this hypothesis, and the worry that got us to it, have traction. Does this mean that Nanay's distributed attention is not aesthetic? Again, there's reason to favor the opposite reading, at least for serious consideration: this is aesthetic attention but it is a far more common mental phenomenon than Nanay claims. This may come at a cost in the work it will do for aesthetics. But it might also be a virtue when doing philosophy of perception. Perhaps what Nanay has identified, by doing some aesthetics as philosophy of perception, is a new insight on how to understand not just the aesthetic expert but, more generally, perceptual experts. Or put another way, perhaps perceptual experts are, in some important sense, domain-specific aesthetic experts. And so the exciting payoff would be to ultimately learn about general perceptual phenomena by looking at the special aesthetic cases in art appreciation. And this, after all, would still be in keeping with the title of Nanay's fine book; it would be Aesthetics as Philosophy of Perception.


Many thanks to John Kulvicki and Dom Lopes for reading and commenting on an earlier draft.


Bukach, C.M., Gauthier, I., and Tarr, M.J. 'Beyond faces and modularity: the power of an expertise framework.' TRENDS in Cognitive Science 10(2006): 159-66.

Scolari, M., Ester, E.F., and Serences, J.T. 'Feature- and Object-based attentional modulation in the human visual system.' The Oxford Handbook of Attention. Ed. by A.C. Nobre and S. Kastner, Oxford University Press, 2014.

Scott, L.S. 'Face Perception and Perceptual Expertise in Adult and Developmental Populations.' The Oxford Handbook of Face Perception. Ed. by A. Calder, G. Rhodes, M. Johnson, and J. Haxby, Oxford University Press, 2011.

Vogt, T. and Magnussen, S. 'Expertise in pictorial perception: eye-movement patterns and visual memory in artists and laymen.' Perception 36 (2007): 91-100.