Aesthetics, Metaphysics, Language: Essays on Heidegger and Gadamer

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Stefano Marino, Aesthetics, Metaphysics, Language: Essays on Heidegger and Gadamer, Cambridge Scholars, 2015, 141pp., $71.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781443876506.

Reviewed by John McCumber, UCLA


This book is a series of separate essays exploring the relationships of Gadamer and Heidegger to each other and to other figures such as Arendt, McDowell, and Rorty. The unifying factor is not so much a philosophical thesis as, first, sympathy for the two eponymous Germans, and then for Gadamer over Heidegger. Each essay is clearly written, extremely well-informed, lucid and insightful.

Because the essays are self-contained, each needs to be summarized, but with a warning: they contain so many fascinating digressions and obiter dicta that no summary can do full justice to any of them.

The first essay, "Gadamer and McDowell on Second Nature, World/Environment, and Language," is the longest and most complex in the book. It traces Gadamer's and McDowell's attempts to distinguish between humans and animals without maintaining, as philosophers have for millennia, that humans have unique access to a non-naturalistic realm. It argues that while McDowell has taken on some of Gadamer's insights concerning naturalism, particularly in "calling into question the explanatory capacity of modern scientific naturalism when applied to the fact of our embodiment" (p. 31), he does not draw on the complex German tradition of philosophical anthropology from which Gadamer's insights derive (Gehlen, Plessner, Heidegger, Scheler, von Uexküll).

Tracing relevant aspects of that tradition in an economical but well-informed way, Stefano Marino concludes that the Germans provide a much more complete account of how embodiment gives rise to culture than does McDowell: "McDowell simply equates Bildung with the local space of reasons [and] does not explain how conceptual and linguistic capacities 'are tied to the bodily structure that is peculiar to our species'" (p. 33). Thus, "McDowell's naturalism of second nature might be profitably complemented with a phenomenological-anthropological account of cognition that is always 'embodied and situated'" (ibid.).

The second essay, "Gadamer on Heidegger: The History of Being as Philosophy of History," deals with Gadamer's skepticism regarding Heidegger's "history of Being" (Seinsgeschichte), which has long been recognized as one of the most problematic aspects of his thought. According to Marino, Gadamer's critique of the "violence" of Heidegger's interpretations of previous philosophers focuses on three points.

First, Heidegger did not have enough knowledge of Greek to sustain his interpretations of Plato, Aristotle, and the Presocratics. Read correctly, for example, Plato is not the dogmatic idealist Heidegger took him to be; his Greek is a language of concrete questions and answers, not the kind of abstractly ontological enterprise Heidegger pursues. This leads to Gadamer's second criticism: Heidegger to the contrary, there is no single "language of metaphysics;" all philosophers take their terms, ultimately, from living speech. And third, Heidegger's Seinsgeschichte has eschatological and absolutist aspects that point, not to truth, but to undigested Hegelianism. Gadamer, of course, does not reject Heidegger's thought in toto (p. 59); rather, he adopts certain of its themes (as in his account of the "prejudiced" nature of thought, which always depends on a particular tradition) while rejecting the overall project of Seinsgeschichte as the work of someone who "was veritably driven by his own questions and a desire to rediscover himself everywhere" (quoted from Gadamer on p. 51).

A similar taste for the concrete, finally, runs through Gadamer's aesthetics. Gadamer sees Kant's "subjectivizing" of aesthetics as a radical break in its history, while Heidegger sees aesthetics as continuous from its Greek beginnings. While both criticize Kantian aesthetics, then, for Gadamer aesthetics needs to return to the concrete; for Heidegger, it must rarify itself into (Heideggerean) ontology.

Marino's third essay, "Gadamer's and Arendt's Divergent Appropriations of Kant: Taste, Sensus Communis, and Judgment" begins from the fact that while Gadamer and Arendt shared Heidegger as a teacher, with both taking from him the view that science cannot provide a full understanding of human life, they rarely referred to one another. Their appropriations of Kant, in particular, are utterly divergent. Arendt thinks that Kant's account of judgment, and in particular his account of "enlarged thought," according to which we seek to see the world from the perspectives of others, opens the way to a politicization of basic aesthetic concepts. For Gadamer what Kant has done is exclude the sociopolitical valences those concepts had in the humanist tradition (p. 77). Where for Arendt Kant politicizes the conceptual repertoire of aesthetics, for Gadamer he does the precise opposite. Marino concludes that while Gadamer's interpretation of Kant is more scrupulous, Arendt's is more fruitful for ethical and political thought (p. 79).

In the fourth essay, "Gadamer's Hermeneutical Aesthetics of Tragedy and the Tragic," Marino places Gadamer's views on tragedy in the context, once again, of his rejection of scientism. What tragedy teaches us that science cannot is the "the absoluteness of the barrier that separates the human from the divine" (quoted from Gadamer on p. 88): we are always suspended between "openness to possibility," i.e. hope in the future, and "an awareness of death as our inescapable and insurmountable limit" (p. 90). This applies, Gadamer argues, to experience itself: it is always and essentially experience of human finitude. Tragedy, then, is a paradigmatic human experience. Its seemingly unreal, "playful" character comes from the way it demarcates itself from everyday life: everything in the tragedy is "transformed into structure," i.e. the vagrant meaninglessness of much of human living is omitted (we may ask what color Antigone's eyes are, but Sophocles does not). Tragedy thus takes place within a dramatic field strictly demarcated from the rest of life. This field, however, includes for Gadamer the spectators, and so "aims to include within its borders everything that stands outside" (p. 93).

This self-enclosure of individual tragedies then poses a question about tragedy itself: can a set of things so utterly self-enclosed come from anything else? Are we to follow Nietzsche and understand tragedy in terms of its undeniable religious origins, or with Vernant and see its historical origins, whether religious or not, as irrelevant to what it became? Gadamer's concept of transformation (Verwandlung) into structure shows that at the core of tragedy is precisely its own self-separation from its religious origins in the form of its strictly demarcative structure. Gadamer thus steers a middle ground between Nietzsche and Vernant: he makes it possible for us "to recognize the religious origin of tragedy without at the same time being forced to deny tragedy's autonomous aesthetic" (p. 100).

The last essay, "Heidegger and Rorty: Philosophy and/as Poetry and Literature," takes up two theses of Rorty: his "radical, resolute, and consistent" claim that philosophy should be a kind of literature (p. 111), and his view that in Heidegger philosophy becomes a kind of poetry (p. 110). Rorty criticizes the latter: what philosophy should assimilate itself to is not poetry, but the novel -- a move Heidegger never makes because of his overall disdain for narrative (p. 112). While Marino believes that Rorty's reading of Heidegger opens us up to important "pragmatic" features of Heidegger's thought, such as his "elevation of social praxis over theoretical knowledge" and his distrust of foundational principles (p. 113), Rorty does not deal with a number of other aspects of Heidegger's thought: the fact that Heidegger always considered himself in some sense to be a "scientific" philosopher (p. 114); that he never conflated poetry and philosophy but always retained a sense of their contrasts (pp. 115-116); and that his criticisms of the scientific conception of truth as correspondence were always in the service of another, and quite robust, conception of truth (p. 116). Marino's judgment on Rorty is like Gadamer's verdict on Seinsgeschichte: individual insights are valuable, but as an interpretation of Heidegger Rorty's approach misses a great deal.

While there are, as always, things to quibble with in Marino's various accounts (in what sense did Heidegger think his later thought was "scientific," for example?), his readings of the widely different thinkers he treats are throughout delicate and scrupulous, and the connections he makes are illuminating. This book contains a wealth of insights valuable to any analytical philosopher seeking to understand the continental tradition and vice-versa.