Placeholder book cover

Theodor W. Adorno, Aesthetics, Eberhard Ortland (ed.), Wieland Hoban (trans.), Polity Press, 2018, 350pp., $69.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780745679396.

Reviewed by Lydia Goehr, Columbia University


This translation of Theodor W. Adorno's lectures on aesthetics is of the excellent volume published by Suhrkamp Verlag in 2009 under the editorship of Eberhard Ortland. Adorno lectured on the topic six times between 1950 and 1968; the edition is drawn from the most coherent and extensive notes in the archive, recorded for the winter semester of 1958/9. The editor's erudite notes as well as Adorno's original keywords and fascinating lecture plans are included. The lectures may be read as an introduction to the more difficult Aesthetic Theory, posthumously published in 1970 after Adorno's death in 1969 on the basis of drafts also written throughout the 1960s. The latter was translated into English in 1984 and again in 2009.

To remark on the difficulty of Adorno's writings and their translation is almost a cliché. Since, however, clichés carry traces of truth, it is worth noting straightaway how far Adorno adapted his thought for lectures in the classroom. He did not dumb the thought down, but situated it historically to educate students in what had been written in the field and to show what was at stake for him in tackling the field as he did. His lectures tell far more explicitly than his published writings the background of his thinking, his education in aesthetics, his reading of contemporary literature. There are also considerable first-person references serving as signposts to what he intends to argue and cover. His lectures make explicit the terms of aesthetic theory as a mode of philosophical critique, whereas his written works are much more exemplifications of the critique. Or, the lectures render transparent what in his written texts is contained more as immanent form. The lectures are, therefore, far from redundant. We may even read them as we do sketches and studies produced by artists in preparation for the artworks whose final meanings are not worn on their sleeves.

The lectures on aesthetics are an indispensable addition to the other editions of lectures that have recently been published on metaphysics, moral philosophy, history and freedom, and the negative dialectic. They are indispensable because they show the workings of aesthetic theory in philosophy more generally, when, whatever the topic, philosophy shows itself willing to submit to its own immanent critique against its positivistic tendency to discipline its thought through too pure an engagement of logic or reason. To discipline thought, for Adorno, is to erase what cannot be contained by the logic of achieved concepts: the mimetic trace or aesthetic movement that sustains the ongoing and open labor of thinking. When this movement is excluded, concepts tend to become closed off from all that gives thought its particularity, contingency, and historicity, even, we are told, its expressivity and life. He writes of the closure as a pyrrhic victory: the concepts seem clarified but dialectically they only affirm the tendencies toward complacency, rigidity, and regression in the society at large.

With access to the lectures today, we have a choice: to teach Adorno either according to his own strategies of teaching, or through the works that have so shaped the reception of his thought. It would be best to have the chance to do both. But the issue is more complex. We might think it correct to draw on only his most authoritative works were it not for his critique of authority and for the fact that some of his works, and his Aesthetic Theory is one, were never completed. Adorno in fact left quite a few manuscripts unfinished, on Beethoven and on mechanical reproduction, and in part, so I have come to believe, because the form of the finished book suited his thought rather less well than the more open essay form. One might read his unfinished Aesthetic Theory as an extended essay, or indeed as an uneasy combining of the many essays he published in his lifetime that contain much of the same material, in this way justifying what Schopenhauer (who lived on the same street as Adorno) early wrote of his own work, that like the city of Thebes, one could reach what matters most at its center by a hundred different gates.

Another take on the same choice as to what we read is via the case of Hegel, where today we have more access than in former times to the lectures from which some of his most received works were produced posthumously. Here, the case is complicated by the discrepancies between the lecture-notes often recorded by students and the amplifications offered by the editors. Which Hegel do we teach, the one of the lectures or the one of the books that so shaped his reception? Extended to Adorno, the case is perhaps less complicated, even where there is the presence of an editorial hand. But the deeper point is that the entire reception of these great thinkers may nowadays be challenged and reworked given what the new archive affords us: the sense of there being so many gates or versions that saying "this is the theory" becomes as unstable as declaring with confidence of an artwork that "this is the work." Thinking always thought in the same way was, for Adorno, no better than musical works always performed in the same way. Versions and variations retained a dialectical movement as in play, or a constellation of diverse and competing elements intact. For thought to be exacting upon thinkers was not the same as a thought being made so exact that it left no space to be rethought over and over again.

The lectures, unlike his written works, also retain the impression of his spoken or live voice. That the contrast of speaking and writing was an issue as old as the Socratic hills was what in part inspired Adorno to begin his lectures drawing on the ancient contest between philosophy and the arts. He notes the difficult place of aesthetics in the profession of philosophy, where the professionalism has encouraged a disdain for so much of what matters to aesthetics: the corporeal, living, and fully embodied forms of beauty, the voices of pleasure, sensuousness, and desire. What would it mean, he wants to know, for the profession to admit such matters as these?

Adorno is likewise acutely aware that his critical-aesthetic theory is always also a mediated social theory conveyed and communicated by different technological means. Mediation via the media means that what works in writing does not always come to the same result in the classroom, or on the radio or television. The classroom was not for him a political arena, nor a place of entertainment, even if he showed quite some wit and style and always took the social situation into account. Today, we can teach Adorno by listening to his recorded lectures and talks on Youtube, where hearing his spoken voice brings attention to the rhythm and pitch of his highly articulated sentences. But, again, the relevant theoretical point is that we are much advantaged by these lectures on aesthetics if we want to understand the many challenges of the new media and the most recent technologies to our own current currents of art and thought. For even as we want to say today that art and thought are no more immune to technological mediation than any other social form, then, so Adorno shows in these lectures, and contra any reductionist tendency toward what he calls identity thinking: truthfulness of art and thought resides in their internal or formal capacity dialectically to resist or withdraw from the particular meaning of the social form in which they are presently embodied, this way remaining open to other ways to appear and to mean.

The editor of the volume tells us that the lectures are particularly revealing for the situation of education in Germany in the 1950s and 1960s, a situation that preoccupied Adorno deeply, his having returned from exile in the United States to Germany after a war that had left the schools without male teachers, and schools where surviving teachers needed to be reeducated. To effect a reeducation, the language had to be stripped of associations that had contributed to the catastrophe. To write an aesthetics after the war was a critical task. It was to participate in a reeducation "after (nach) Auschwitz." But was this possible? Could one produce a theory or an artwork that did not capitulate to the remaining capitalistic and totalitarian conditions of total war? Here, the use of the term "total" inverted Hegel's "The Whole is True" to render the Whole False, meaning that every nook and cranny of the society, including our capacity for aesthetic experience, seemed still threatened by death.

But so, too, Adorno argued, the language of aesthetic theory itself. He destabilized not only the meanings but also the grammar to produce sentences that made their translation an almost impossible task, and especially when the English terms carried social and political connotations that the German terms did not. He was highly conscious of translation, often using American terms, or particular German terms that had been taken into exile to preserve a meaning separated from the manipulations back home in Nazi Germany, a home to which he had returned only to find his city of Frankfurt lying in ruins. In the lectures, and given again our own political times, one feels the urgency of his address to the new students in Frankfurt, aware of the pressure they were under to confront the past of their parents while yet swept up in the liberating promise of the sixties. Would this promise be broken as promises had been broken before? He recalled the heritage of an extraordinary culture and philosophical learning that had been twisted through catastrophic capitulation into a modern barbarism. He hoped the same would not happen again.

His lectures on aesthetics look back to ancient philosophers and tragedians, though with a focus given less to Aristotle than to Plato and Socrates. He addresses the thought of Goethe, Kant, Schiller, Kierkegaard, Schopenhauer, Wagner, Nietzsche, and, significantly, Hegel, with whom he aligned his thinking the most. As his concerns turn to modernism, the avant-garde and to post-war art, he discusses in more or less detail Schoenberg, Cage, and Stockhausen, Valéry, Proust, and Brecht, Freud and Benjamin, and many other better and lesser known figures. He moves as comfortably through the histories of the so-named fine and popular arts as through the history of Western philosophy. For readers already acquainted with his writings, the references and allusions in these lectures will feel familiar; for initiates, they will afford new insight into the impressively vast, but also selective, library of his mind.

Tracing the attempted mastery and construction of nature (of what was not human) as part of the dialectic of enlightenment, he asks whether any distinction remains between natural and artistic beauty. He surveys the problem from Plato to Kant and Hegel, seeking in beauty the route not only to the sublime, but also to freedom. Restricting beauty is tantamount to an unfreedom, leaving him to ask of his own times, whether aesthetic experience is still possible in the ways that Kant and Hegel explored by showing what was demanded both of the subject and the object to bring them into the right relation with each other. It is the social and historical erosion of this relation that undermines the possibility of art and thought in present times, far more than any explanation, as he makes explicit, that relies on straight accounts of biography, history, or empirical psychology. He is far more persuaded by Marxist, Nietzschean, and Freudian diagnoses of ideology, illusion, and repression, and not least because, in each, he finds terms for a potential rescue or cure.

Adorno engages key modernist themes: the fate of aura in the age of technological reproducibility, secularism and profanation in the arts, and the many masteries and barbarisms to which the arts responded through a post-war aesthetic of melancholy and suffering. He addresses how art turned inward into a concealment, dissonance, fragmentation, and withdrawal in the face of the socially administered society, or what otherwise he described as the culture industry. In Lecture 6, he asks: "Why does art express only what has been destroyed in us?", though immediately he notes that this is neither art's sole task nor the task of expression that art alone takes on. When, therefore -- and this is crucial -- he speaks of the task of art, or of its doing this or that, he is not making a typical essentialist claim. Not all art withdraws, he insists: most, in fact, capitulates to the social situation. If there is an essentialism, it is to be understood dynamically, through a history of changing constellations of competing tendencies of concepts and things. But this means also that, by the end of the lectures, one comes to understand the black and white mistake in believing that philosophy is always in error and art always on the path to truth: truth and error are part of both, as of everything else. To tell the right story of philosophy's relation to art depends then on working with an aesthetic theory that is always itself a contradiction both in and of the dominant terms.

He concludes Lecture 4: if everything good about nature looks to us now as though it has been driven out by a pitchfork, then the good needs to be rescued by turning the pitchfork to a better use. In immanent critique, one changes the way the tools are used and less the tools themselves, although in English a pitchfork might be inverted to become a fork that now strikes the right pitch in tune. I have played with Adorno's last line only to note how important such lines were for him given how he wrote them to gesture toward a rescue and hope that the future would not be as the present. The gestures toward difference against the pursuit of sameness made critique -- thinking and thinking again in a new way -- purposeful.

I highly recommend these lectures. One may read them as a contribution to the basic and familiar issues of philosophy and the arts, but also, so I have suggested here, as a contribution to rethinking philosophy as critical theory. Quibbles with a few terms aside, the translator is to be congratulated for not having done away with the living voice of a philosopher in the practice of teaching, who, while acknowledging the need to be didactic, made his thought just complex enough that his students would be led, he hoped, not to take the professor's words at face value, but to think for themselves.