Affects, Actions and Passions in Spinoza: The Unity of Body and Mind

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Chantal Jaquet, Affects, Actions and Passions in Spinoza: The Unity of Body and Mind, Tatiana Reznichenko (tr.), Edinburgh University Press, 2018, 168pp., $105.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781474433181.

Reviewed by Amy M. Schmitter, The University of Alberta


Chantal Jaquet's L'unité du corps et de l'esprit. Affects, actions passions chez Spinoza, recently translated into English by Tatiana Reznichenko, is a short book with a bold claim that: attributing a "parallelism" to Spinoza distorts his conception of the relation of mind and body. Instead we should speak of mind and body as "equal" [aequalis] and the same [or 'at once,' simul], both in their power of acting and in the order and connection of modes under the attributes of thinking and extension. Parallelism has been one way of understanding the unity of mind and body without reduction to one or the other side. Jaquet offers a revisionist way of conceiving that unity by looking at what Spinoza means by 'affect' [affectus] and how it illustrates the relations of aequalis and simul through what she calls a "mixed discourse," which sometimes emphasizes the mental aspect of an affect, sometimes the corporeal, and sometimes both together. Jaquet's approach does a great deal of justice to the dialectic of Spinoza's work in the Ethics, particularly to her main focus, Part III, where many commentators have been struck (and frustrated) by what looks like Spinoza's frequent changes of perspective and explanatory framework. But if Jaquet is right, this is just what we should expect from a mixed discourse illustrating that mind and body are aequalis and simul, without requiring that each aspect of a human being marches in lockstep uniformity with the other.

Jaquet sets up her project in the context of Spinoza's recent popularity among researchers investigating the affects, most notably the neuroscientist Antonio Damasio, whose Looking for Spinoza: Joy, Sorrow, and the Feeling Brain was translated into French as Spinoza Avait Raison [Spinoza was Right]. (Jaquet's book originally appeared in 2004, immediately after the publication of Damasio's.) In a brief introduction and again in the conclusion, Jaquet notes how Damasio endorses Spinoza's approach to psychophysical unity as a way to avoid the interaction problems of Cartesian dualism, holding that "mind and body are parallel and mutually correlated processes, mimicking each other at every crossroads, as two faces of the same thing" (Damasio 2003, p. 12, cited in Jaquet 6). In short, parallelism replaces interactionism.

But it is just this picture of Spinoza's monism, writ both large and small, that Jaquet sets out to undermine, arguing in Chapter One that we should "ban the term 'parallelism' and replace it with 'equality'" (19). There she notes that this popular, indeed dominant, coinage for describing the relation of mind and body ultimately comes from Leibniz, where it describes relations between events on two very different levels, in souls and in matter. Jaquet maintains that the ascendency of the Leibnizian term misleads us by introducing "a form of irreducible dualism and plurality" (14), while demanding one-to-one equivalences between parallel modes in a "monolithic correspondence" (17). She ridicules this demand by citing Spinoza's amusing example of a householder who cries that his yard has flown into his neighbor's hen, where the absurdity arises from a failure of the utterance to express the surprised man's ideas. Instead, she emphasizes that throughout the Ethics, and particularly in the crucial Proposition 7 of Part II, Spinoza asserts the identity and unity of mind and body -- that they are aequalis and simul. Understanding what those modifiers mean and how the unity of equality manifests in the affects is the task of the rest of the book. Jaquet insists that this equality is perfectly compatible with diversity of expressions, for "certain events are better or more strongly expressed in one register than another" (17). Were we to compare the body to Clark Kent and the mind to Superman, we might say they are the same individual, whose alien origins are better expressed by Superman. This sort of unity-in-divergent-expressions is developed throughout the book and tackled head-on in the conclusion.

One way in which this diversity is expressed is through the mixed discourse that Jaquet finds, particularly in Part III of the Ethics. Chapter Two identifies an antecedent of this genre in Descartes's Passions of the Soul, to which Spinoza devotes a large portion of the preface of Part III, and even more of Part V -- while saying little about anyone else. Yet Spinoza criticizes Descartes's account of the passions as showing only his shrewd [acutus] intellect and nothing more. Jaquet argues convincingly that the later Descartes is proto-Spinozist insofar as Cartesian passions integrate body and soul, a feature marked by Descartes's carefully delineating what operations belong to the body and what to the soul, before showing how the passions weave them together. As such Descartes exemplifies a form of the "mixed discourse" and many of the scientific ambitions Jaquet finds in Spinoza. Where he goes wrong by Spinoza's lights (as interpreted by Jaquet) is in understanding the causality of the passions and the way in which they show psychophysical unity, since he is still wedded to dualist interaction, dramatized by the career of the pineal gland. For this reason, Jaquet maintains Descartes cannot properly conceptualize the "remedy" for the passions, that is, the sort of power that the mind can exercise in the face of unruly passions. And so despite his shrewdness, he gave only "false solutions to true problems" (46).

Chapter Three places the discussion of affects in the Ethics in the context of Spinoza's corpus. Looking first at Spinoza's early Short Treatise on God, Man and His Well-Being, and then the rather different Theological-Political Treatise (TPT), Jaquet traces his movement from an interactionist model of mind and body and a thoroughly passive view of affects (all of which are labeled 'passions') in the Short Treatise to an intermediate stage in the TPT, where he introduces the vocabulary of 'affects,' but without all of the distinctive concepts of the Ethics. Instead, Jaquet speaks of the TPT as showing a "Hobbesian phase in Spinoza's thought" (57). Against this background, she argues that the concept of affect in the Ethics -- comprising both passions and active affects, for which the mind is an adequate cause -- is an innovation. It marks an increasing dynamism in the approach to knowledge, affect, and indeed ontology as a whole, particularly in the conception of conatus and the power of acting as the essence of singular things.

Chapter Four squarely confronts the concept of affect in the Ethics, concentrating on Part III, which offers two different accounts, first in D3 (henceforth EIIID3), and second, in the "general definition of the affects" at the very end. This is the book's longest chapter. Jaquet goes into painstaking, sometimes maddening, detail to reconcile EIIID3's description of affect "as affections of the body by which the body's power of acting is increased or diminished, aided or restrained, and at the same time [et simul] the ideas of these affections" (Curley, p. 493) with the seemingly more restrictive claim that an affect "which is called a passion of the mind is a confused idea, by which the mind affirms of its body, or of some part of it, a greater or lesser force of existing than before, which, when it is given, determines the mind to think of this rather than that" (EIII.gen.def, Curley, pp. 542-3). As EIIID3 shows (at least if we take the claim of simul seriously), affects are both physical and psychological.

Jaquet traces how Spinoza remodels the general ontological term affectus to capture the expanded scope of his conception, while distinguishing it both from affectio and the more restrictive passio, as well as some of the translation difficulties that poses. She then argues that the restrictions introduced in the supposedly "general" definition concern the narrow aims of the section by directing attention to the aspects of the affects of most concern to us in order to exercise the power of the mind. This, she proposes, is just what we should expect from a mixed discourse, focused here on the psychological expression of the relevant affects. To make her case, Jaquet goes on to consider the taxonomy and classification of the affects, insisting both on the primacy of the three primitive affects of desire (or appetite), joy and sorrow, and on a fourfold classification of their dynamics: affects can impact our powers of acting either by expanding or reducing the body's power directly, or through transitions in the power of things we love, hate or are in some other way associated with. Pity is a sadness at another's misfortune, and envy is an even more complicated form of sadness arising from imagining the fortune of those whom we hate. These and other such affects "concern the effects of the power of another on our own, and its indirect consequences. They mostly involve affective imitation and fall under an ethics of similitude" (126). Because of the "affective mimicry" involved, such affects circulate among various kinds of bodies (including political bodies).

There is a great deal more in this chapter, but a crucial outcome is Jaquet's argument that "affect" can apply to the body, the mind or both together. Spinoza uses the foregrounding of one or another aspect as a differential principle for naming species of affect, e.g., the cheerfulness that characterizes an overall increase in the power of the body. One especially interesting move is to distinguish between the amor erga Deum, the love towards God that is constant -- and as EVP14 shows, can be related to every affect -- and the amor intellectis Deum, the intellectual love of God that is eternal. The first "applies to the love of God related to both mind and body, and the other to the love of God related to the mind alone" (111; see EV20schol). On this basis, Jaquet argues that the psychophysical amor erga Deum qualifies as a genuine affection, with a transition to greater perfection in body and mind, while the intellectual love of God does not, since it is part of God's own perfection (112).

The last chapter reflects on what this "new mixed approach" (25) shows about the equality of mind and body. Jaquet concedes that "all discourse on the affects has a psychophysical essence to a certain extent" (143). But affects are conceived and defined by assigning different weights to mind, to body or to their union, "according to the dominant or equivalent role mind and body play in [their] formation" (136). Here one may wonder just what Jaquet means by the "dominance" of mind, body, or both in an affect. She uses a number of different terms as well, e.g., "prevailing" (93), "priority" and "primacy" (95), which depend on the "angle of analysis under which [an affect] is conceived" (147), or to reformulate Spinoza's language, considering matters either sub specie corporis or sub specie mentis (148). But glossing these formulations is tricky: that an affect prioritizes either the mind or the body cannot be understood to indicate causal priority, since Spinoza rejects interaction. Jaquet sometimes seems to mean conceptual priority, but that too is risky, considering how closely Spinoza ties conceptual order to the order of either immanent or transitive causes (see, e.g., EIIP6). What she has in mind becomes a bit clearer in the conclusion, where she addresses the notion of expression. On the one hand, the mind is just the idea of the body, the objective essence of which the body is the formal essence (11); on the other hand, there is often a "difference in expression specific to the modes of each attribute" (155). Unlike Deleuze, Jaquet argues that we should expect expressions of the same under different angles of analysis not to be uniform; because they do not form two monologues, they are better captured by a mixed discourse that weights whatever expression is best suited to the demands at hand. She ends by gesturing at topics discussed in her other works, such as whether the relation of equality-and-difference-in-expression might extend to the body of the state and its idea (159). Ironically enough, the picture that emerges from her rejection of parallelism looks rather like the relations that Leibniz takes to hold between monads, albeit inverted: whereas Leibniz seeks to integrate monads into a single, harmoniously unified world by taking them as different, but coordinated and reflecting perspectives, Spinoza takes mind and body to be different expressions of an underlying unity.

There is a great deal more than what I have been able to discuss in this deceptively small book: Jaquet pays meticulous attention to Spinoza's language and its shifts in and across texts, which I found particularly helpful in the Chapter Three discussion of how the accounts of the passions and affects develop from his early work to the Ethics and Political Treatise. I have concentrated on the striking central thesis that identity and sameness of mind and body does not entail parallelism, but is instead expressed in diverse ways and articulated in a mixed account. However, one might wonder whether the attribution of parallelism is really as misleading as Jaquet maintains. Most scholars of Spinoza explain basic features of his system by privileging accounts unfolding under one attribute rather than the other. For instance, it is common to explain individuation of complex single individuals (e.g., human beings) through the individuation of their bodies, which retain their natures -- despite growth, metabolism and alterations of separably moving parts -- insofar as they preserve a super-ratio of motion and rest across the communication among the parts (an awkward gloss of L5-L7 of EIIP13schol). Presumably, we can individuate the mind by its objective relation to the persevering body, without describing its individuating conditions in strictly ideational terms. Still, many scholars may see the need to do so as representing a lacuna in Spinoza's system. Jaquet's thesis is a salutary correction to the thought that we really ought to be able to cash out parallel accounts, and gives a principled reason for the shifts in perspective that run through central parts of the Ethics. That said, it remains an open question why the nature of one attribute allows for stronger expressions of some points than what could appear under the other attribute: what, for instance, is it about extension such that individuation is better expressed through the body than the mind?

One might also take issue with Jaquet's reading of some of Spinoza's predecessors on the passions and affects. She is so committed to showing Spinoza's undoubtedly important debt to Descartes that she may overstate their similarities. For one, Descartes's "internal emotions" differ from Spinoza's active affects in important ways. The latter might be equally well compared to the eupatheia or constantia recognized by some Stoics -- who (despite the claim on 29n.10) are mentioned alongside Descartes in the preface to Part V. Moreover, Descartes takes what he considers to be the functions ["usage"] of the passions as a basic classificatory principle (see Passions of the Soul §52), while Spinoza rejects such putatively teleological talk. Jaquet also claims that the Hobbesian bent of the Theological-Political Treatise largely disappears in the Ethics (57). But not only does Part IV show many Hobbesian concerns (see E IVP37schol2), the two philosophers share basic similarities of approach: particularly, the conception of the affects as appetitive and expressive of 'endeavour' [conatus], and the repeated denial of final causes in favor of understanding our affects as end-determining, along with the ambitions to produce a geometric-style science. To be sure, Hobbes is reductionist in his materialism in a way that sharply diverges from the picture Jaquet paints of Spinoza. But that is compatible with Hobbes still exerting considerable influence -- perhaps even modeling a mixed discourse at other levels.

This edition contains no translator's preface, only a brief note about how Reznichenko used Curley's translation of Spinoza's works. This is unfortunate: translating a work that depends heavily on close reading must be both challenging and interesting, and there are some interpolations and expansions on the original text of 2004 that are not clearly marked (e.g., the evaluation of Descartes's interactionism in 5n.13). Reznichenko helpfully provides references for the standard English editions of most of the primary literature, and extends Jaquet's discussion of problems in converting Spinoza's works into contemporary languages (78n.12). For the most part, the translation choices cleave closely to the sentence structure of the French and prefer near cognates in vocabulary (sometimes a bit awkwardly). There is much to be said for what one might non-literally call a 'literal' translation. But it also comes with costs. The discussion is chock-full of details, and Chapter Four, in particular, has many moving parts. I confess that I often found it difficult to track the line of argument, and part of this might be because directly converting the sentence structure of scholarly French into English can produce overly complicated sentences and somewhat oblique phrasing, with multiple negations (indeed an extra 'not' seems to have snuck in to the first sentence on 134). There may be a lesson in here that reinforces Jaquet's thesis: that expression of the same may require violating strict parallelism. But these are small matters. Translation of scholarly books is difficult, tiresome, and far too often, largely thankless. We should be grateful that Reznichenko has done the hard work to make Jaquet's ambitious and formidable challenge widely available to Anglophone audiences.


Damasio, Antonio. Looking for Spinoza: Joy, Sorrow, and the Feeling Brain. Orlando: Harcourt, Inc. 2003.

Descartes, René. Oeuvres de Descartes, vol. 11, eds. C. Adam and P. Tannery. Paris: J. Vrin, 1996.

Jaquet, Chantal. L'unité du corps et de l'esprit. Affects, actions passions chez Spinoza. Paris: Presses Universitaires de France. 2004, 2015.

Spinoza, Baruch. The Collected Works of Spinoza, vol. I, ed. and trans. E. Curley, Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1985.