Affirmative Action and Racial Preference

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Cohen, Carl and Sterba, James P., Affirmative Action and Racial Preference, Oxford University Press, 2003, 394pp, $18.00 (pbk), ISBN 0195148959.

Reviewed by Stephen Kershnar, SUNY-Fredonia


Carl Cohen’s and James Sterba’s debate is an impressive discussion of the legality and morality of various types of affirmative action and a must read for researchers in this field. These two issues bifurcate. The legality of preferential treatment consists of two different issues: Is preferential treatment Constitutional? Does preferential treatment violate laws other than the Constitution? The morality of preferential treatment also consists of two issues: Is preferential treatment right? Is it good? The discussion in this book is wide-ranging and the authors provide a fascinating set of legal and empirical arguments that are a nice complement to the moral arguments that underlie their positions on affirmative action. The only problem with the book is that the moral arguments are somewhat abbreviated. In the interests of disclosure, I should mention that I have written a number of articles and a book opposed to preferential policies.

The authors disagree over whether to call such policies “preferential treatment” or “affirmative action” and this disagreement reflects a broader disagreement on whether these programs favor less qualified applicants or track a type of qualification. I shall follow Cohen and use the former phrase since I want to rule out outreach programs. Also, I focus on preferential treatment in the context of education since the majority of their arguments and examples are so focused.

The Legality of Affirmative Action

The legality of the preferential treatment rests on whether such policies are compatible with the 1964 Civil Rights Act and the Constitution. The part of the Act that relates to educational institutions says the following.

No person in the United States shall, on the grounds of race, color, or national origin, be excluded from participation in, be denied the benefits of, or be subjected to discrimination under any program or activity receiving Federal financial assistance.

Cohen argues that preferential treatment violates the plain language of the Act (p. 48) and the clear legislative intent of the members of Congress who voted for it (pp. 56-71). In response, Sterba points out that the Act clearly allows for preferences as a means to correct for violations of that act (p. 318) and that Cohen himself admits this (p. 281). Sterba’s idea is that we need to use racial classifications and preferences in order to enforce or correct for violations of the Act. He argues that given that the Act allows for racial classification and preferences, the real issue is over how extensive that use should be.

Part of the issue here rests on how statutes should be interpreted. For example, assume that Cohen is correct about the language and legislative intent of the Act. Further assume that Sterba is correct in that the Act has been consistently interpreted to allow for the use of race as a means of enforcing and correcting violations and that this broad interpretation promotes racial equality. The interpretation of the Act then depends on the weight to be given to the plain language, legislative intent, previous interpretation by preceding courts, and the best means of achieving the Act’s motivating purpose. Without a theory of statutory interpretation, the relevance and weight to be assigned to the different arguments is unclear.

The authors also clash over the Constitutionality of these programs. The Equal Protection Clause states “nor shall any State … deny to any person within its jurisdiction the equal protection of the laws … .” Cohen argues that precedent supports the notion that all racial classification must pass strict scrutiny, i.e., the government must have a compelling interest in the classification and the classification must be a narrowly tailored means by which to promote that interest. He argues that in the case of preferential treatment, various legal parties and academics have put forth the following interests: compensation for discrimination and oppression, racial balance, diversity, role models in educational settings, professional services for minorities, desegregation, and integration. He argues that none of these are compelling interests (pp. 79-106). In contrast, Sterba rejects the strict-scrutiny standard for benign affirmative action and argues that there are several Constitutionally compelling interests, namely compensation for past injuries, educational diversity (including role models), and provision of services to minorities. The arguments here are specific to the purported interest and both authors rely on an assessment of various empirical studies. Except for the last chapter, the discussion predates the 2003 Supreme Court ruling on preferential treatment in educational settings, i.e., Grutter v. Bollinger (No. 02-241) and Gratz v. Bollinger (No. 02-516). However, much of what they argue illuminates their discussion in this chapter.

For example, they argue over the soundness of a study by University of Michigan psychologist Patricia Gurin. Gurin argues that the racial and ethnic composition of a student body correlates positively with classroom diversity, informal discussions of race, and interracial friendships. She argues that these outcomes in turn correlate with positive learning and democratic outcomes (e.g., more active thinking processes and citizen engagement) (p. 323). In contrast, Cohen citing other researchers argues that the Gurin study did not meet minimal scientific standards and in any case actually disconfirmed the claim that campus racial diversity correlates positively with educational excellence. (p. 92) In addition, he argues that were such a positive correlation found, this would be irrelevant since precedent supports allowing race preferences only where necessary for compensation (pp. 94-95). There is an oddity here in that if Sterba is correct, then what the Fourteenth Amendment permits depends in part on an assessment of Gurin’s research, specifically whether it used properly formatted questions, controlled for the proper variables, and found statistically significant correlations. It is not obvious that the interpretation of the Constitution should rest on such technical issues. Again, much here depends on whether the language, legislative history, and precedent permit the use of race preferences to improve educational performance and the tightness of the connection between the classification and the educational outcome. It is interesting to note that the recent Supreme Court cases agreed with Sterba’s conclusion, but avoided getting caught up in the assessment of the Gurin study.

The Morality of Affirmative Action

The discussion of the morality of affirmative action rests on a discussion of its goodness and rightness. I shall focus on the latter, although the authors have many interesting things to say on both issues. The rightness of these programs rests on whether the forward- and backward- looking arguments are sufficient to justify these programs. Let us consider these in turn.

1. The Forward-Looking Argument

Cohen argues against forward-looking justifications of preferential treatment. Specifically, he claims that it has numerous bad effects. For example, he argues that it mismatches students and institutions, injures race relations, removes incentives for minorities to excel academically, and encourages racial separatism. Since his arguments for these claims rest largely on anecdotal accounts, he doesn’t provide much support for them. Sterba in contrast provide an array of interesting statistical arguments for preferential treatment. He argues that diversity has significantly good effects such as improving the overall educational performance and promoting services to minority communities.

Sterba doesn’t address the markedly inferior performance of minorities, especially blacks, at elite institutions. For example, in elite institutions the black dropout rate is double, and sometimes triple, that of white students.1 The average black student also finishes in the bottom quarter of the class.2 Nor does Sterba address other differences such as blacks’ significantly higher bar and medical-board failure or the fact that very few blacks graduate with Ph.D.s in the hard sciences and math.3 Sterba needs to address how this inferior academic performance should be weighed against diversity-related gains. In the absence of an acknowledgement of these tradeoffs and an argument for why the good effects outweigh these bad ones, Sterba’s argument falls short.4 Sterba would likely respond that he only supports preferential treatment programs where blacks, given a suitable educational enhancement program, will in a reasonably short time be as qualified as their white competitors (pp. 250, 260-61, 334). However, if he views qualification as likelihood of performing as well in undergraduate, graduate, or professional programs as white (and Asian) students, then this restriction combined with the current gulf in performance likely rules out the vast majority of current preferential programs. Sterba might view educational qualification as largely unrelated to academic performance, since he makes a point of noting that grades don’t correlate with successful careers (measured in terms of income, satisfaction, and community service) (pp. 336-37). If so, he should make this point more explicitly for it involves a drastic revision of the way in which we think of educational qualifications. In addition, it should be noted that this would provide an excellent reason to discriminate against women who are likely to be stay-at-home mothers since their expected income and job satisfaction is lower than those of similarly able males.

2. The Backward-Looking Argument

Cohen argues race preferences are not justified as compensation for past injustice. He argues that these programs place the burden on compensation unjustly on parties such as current white males who have performed no injustices (pp. 33-37). He also argues that these programs distribute the compensatory benefits unjustly in several ways. First, the programs give benefits to individuals who have not been unjustly injured merely on account of their race (pp. 27-29). Second, the programs fail to give benefits to non-minorities who have been unjustly injured by bad schools and poverty (pp. 29-33). Third, the programs fail to give benefits out in a way that is proportionate to the degree of injury since they help the most well-off minorities (p. 31).

In contrast, Sterba responds that minorities, especially blacks, suffer an array of harms as a result of recent injustices, including segregated housing, unequal education, job discrimination, and unequal health and welfare programs. He also responds that preferential treatment is not unfair to those who lose out on benefits since they benefited from past injustice, especially discrimination (p. 265). In addition, other burdens can be placed on established individuals (especially older white males) to ensure they contribute to the compensation even though they are not applicants for jobs or educational positions. He points out that the narrow scope of affirmative action is not problematic since such programs need not be limited to racial minorities (pp. 262-63). Sterba also asserts that the widespread discrimination and disparities that have resulted from past and present injustices support the presumption in favor of the vast majority of the relevant minorities (especially blacks) being owed compensation.

To decide who won this debate, consider the features of just compensation.

  1. The Parties: The person who caused the unjust harm pays the victim.
  2. The Amount of Compensation: The compensation places the victim in the position that she would have been in had she not been unjustly harmed.
  3. Knowledge of the Amount of Compensation: If no one can reasonably determine the amount of compensation, then compensation is not morally required.

Sterba claims that compensation for racial injustice should be given by a government entity to a class of individuals. This sometimes can be done with a minimum of efficiency only by deviating from pure justice. In particular, it might benefit both the class of legitimate victims and the injuring agent to have a rough test for who receives compensation and how much compensation is paid out. This occurs when the money spent in unwarranted overpayments is dwarfed by the administrative costs of a more individualized determination of compensation. If this is correct, Cohen’s concerns about deviations from unjust compensation are unconvincing, since they likely result from this sort of concern for efficiency.

In addition, if the government owes compensation and it owns the educational resources, it is not obvious that these resources cannot be used to pay off the compensatory debt. Cohen might object that this compensatory mechanism unfairly concentrates the burden of the payoff on a narrow class of individuals, namely the most-qualified applicants and job candidates, as opposed to a broad-based tax that falls on a broader class. However, any compensatory mechanism (e.g., lump-sum payments) will concentrate compensation in some parties (e.g., the rich pay most of the income taxes).5 Sterba might respond to this by proposing that established individuals might be asked to contribute to compensation in other ways (pp. 268-69).

Here is where Cohen and Sterba need to address two issues: Does the government owe compensation? Do we have adequate evidence of the amount of compensation owed? Let us consider these arguments.

Sterba does not establish that the government owes compensation. This is important since the government is the one paying out the compensation, albeit with the money of taxpayers. Sterba repeatedly focuses on the claim that blacks and other minorities have been harmed in the recent past and present. This allows him to avoid the objection that injustices in the distant past caused the existence of current blacks and other minorities and hence cannot ground a compensatory claim. However, the injustices to current blacks, particularly ones who are currently applying to educational institutions, were almost entirely caused by private agents. This can be seen in that Sterba’s own examples of injustices after 1970 (e.g., AT&T, Shoney’s Restaurant chain, and Texaco) focus on private parties. Pre-1970 injustices (e.g., school segregation) probably had significant effects on reproduction patterns and thus give rise to the causing-existence problems that Sterba aims to avoid.

Sterba also does little to establish that we have adequate evidence of the amount of compensation. This is problematic since such an absence makes it unjust to require that compensation be paid.6 To see this, consider the following example: Destroyed Shed.

Al drives negligently and ploughs into Bob’s property, destroying a seldom-used shed. The shed is worth $100. The owner, who inherited the property, has no idea whether the shed had any valuable contents.

Here we intuitively think that it is unjust to for the court to award damages beyond $100 since any additional damages would rest not rest on a reasonable estimation. Large payments, e.g., damages equal to a spot at the University of Michigan Law School, would be (or likely be) terribly unjust. Consider whether blacks have been significantly harmed by recent injustices. It is a live controversy whether a substantial part of black underperformance in school is due to their being less intelligent than their white and Asian peers. This is especially problematic if the difference in intelligence is significant and more than half of this results from genetic differences.7 In addition, other blacks are probably a cause of the lack of competitiveness of black applicants and job applicants. For example, blacks commit about 50% of the violent crimes in the U.S. and the majority of black children are born out-of-wedlock and grow up in single-parent households.8 These factors likely produce a competitive disadvantage and for which the state is not liable.

Sterba might assert that disproportionate criminality and out-of-wedlock births are themselves the result of past state injustices. However, the intervention of morally responsible agents in a chain of events can undermine a claim of compensation. For example, consider the following case: Frustrated Factory Worker.

A white owner, Charles, discriminates against a black applicant, Don, by denying him a job at Charles’s factory. Don takes out his frustration on his wife, Erin, by beating her. He breaks her eye socket, jaw, and collarbone. Don would not have acted so violently but for his frustration over Charles’s discrimination.

Even if we view Charles as having acted unjustly, and this is by no means clear given that Charles does not infringe on any obvious moral duty to Don, he does not owe Erin compensation. This is because his injustice did not have a direct connection to Erin’s being harmed. I leave aside the issue of whether this indirectness is to be explained via an indirect causal connection, the unforeseeable relation between Charles’s act and Erin’s injury, the limited nature of Charles’s duties toward Erin, or some other factor. If this correct, then the state is similarly not responsible for problems in the black community that result from choices made by morally responsible black individuals. Since Sterba does not provide any support for the claim that we can reasonably estimate the lack of black or other minority competitiveness caused by state injustice, his argument for state compensation is incomplete.

In response, Sterba claims that these criticisms are beside the point since he is concerned to support preferential treatment on the basis that it will lessen future discrimination, rather than compensating for past injustice. He notes that were he to make such backward-looking arguments, he would have done so via arguments that are context specific.9 There are a few things to note about this response. First, Sterba does, however briefly, defend preferential treatment on the basis of past injustice (p. 252). Second, since he makes no attempt to separate out the effects of past injustice from current discrimination, the evidence he cites in support of remedial programs is best understood as supporting a compensatory argument. Third, the value of eliminating future discrimination is merely one good effect that must be weighed against some of the purported bad effects, e.g., the loss of efficiency.10 Since Sterba doesn’t address these tradeoffs, his argument is stronger if it is seen as having a backward-looking element.

In summary, the debate between Cohen and Sterba is insightful, well researched, and worth reading. Their legal arguments are particularly interesting. In the end, however, neither Cohen nor Sterba provide a plausible argument with regard to whether preferential treatment has effects that make it worth pursuing. Nor does either provide a strong moral case for or against preferential treatment as compensation.11


1. In 1992, the dropout percentages for black and white students are as follows: Harvard (5:3), Princeton (9:5), Pennsylvania (28:10), Cornell (23:8), Stanford (17:6), Duke (16:5), Virginia (16:7), and University of California at Berkeley (42:16). Stephan and Abigail Thernstrom, America in Black and White (New York: Simon & Schuster, 1997), 408 citing Theodore Cross, “What if there was no Affirmative Action to College Admissions? A Refinement of Our Earlier Calculations,” Journal of Blacks in Higher Education 5 (Autumn 1994), 55. The gap is also large when we look at a broader collection of colleges and universities. In a study of freshmen who began college in 1989-1990 at three hundred major colleges and universities the black six-year graduation rate was 40% as compared to 59% for whites. Thernstrom and Thernstrom, 392 citing National Collegiate Athletic Association, 1996 NCAA Division I Graduation-Rates Report (Overland Park: Kansas, 1996), 622.

2. William G. Bowen and Derek Bok, The Shape of the River (Princeton: Princeton University Press, 1998), 72.

3. Carl Cohen illustrates this by noting that in 1988, blacks earned two doctorates in mathematics, two in computer science, and none in astronomy. Cohen cites Abigail Thernstrom, “On the Scarcity of Black Professors,” Commentary 90, no. 1 (July 1990): 22-26 citing data from reports by the National Academy of Sciences, the National Research Council, and the American Council on Education.

4. Elsewhere, Sterba defends this tradeoff by citing the success of minority graduates at selective colleges. James Sterba, “What Really is Pell’s Ideal of Formal Equality?” Journal of Social Philosophy 34 (2003): 303-304. He cites the minority graduates’ high incomes, career satisfaction, and community service. He also notes that black students’ graduation rate at the University of Michigan is higher than that of white students in 305 large universities. However, a tradeoff calculation should involve discounting the first set of effects by the black dropout rate. The second comparison is misguided since it should involve comparing the graduation rate of blacks, whites, and Asian Americans at the University of Michigan rather than comparing Michigan blacks to whites at a large class of schools, most of which are considerably less competitive than Michigan. The former comparison is particularly apt given that Sterba endorses only those preferential-treatment programs where minority applicants, given remedial programs, will be as qualified as their peers.

5. In 2001, the top 10% of taxpayers paid 64.9% of the income taxes. Tax Foundation, “Historical Tables of Income Earned and Taxes Paid In 2003, it is estimated that 29.5% of those filing tax returns pay not taxes (income or payroll). Tax Foundation, “40 Million Filers Pay No Income Taxes, Many Get Generous Refunds,”

6. There is a difficult issue as to whether epistemic concerns undermine or override concerns of justice. I take no position here as to which approach is correct.

7. Herrnstein and Murray estimate that the black-white difference in intelligence is significant (one standard deviation) and that roughly 60% of it is hereditary. Richard J. Herrnstein and Charles Murray argue for the existence of such differences in The Bell Curve (New York: The Free Press, 1994), 276-280, 298-299. The failure of either Cohen or Sterba to discuss this literature, or even mention it, is a glaring omission.

8. For example, in the mid-1990’s blacks had nearly a 70% out-of-wedlock birth rate. Meredith Bagby, Annual Report of the United States of America (New York: McGraw-Hill, 1997), 5, citing the U.S. Census Bureau 1994. See also U.S. Dept. of Health and Human Services, Vital Statistics of the United States, Vol. 1 (Government Printing Office, 1991). Blacks also commit a disproportionately large number of violent crimes. They constitute approximately 50% to 60% of the arrests for murder, about 50% of the arrests for rape, and close to 60% of the arrests for robbery. Neil Alan Weiner and Marvin E. Wolfgang, “The Extent and Character of Violent Crime in America, 1969 to 1982,” in Neil Alan Weiner et al., eds., Violence (Harcourt Brace Jovanovich, 1990), 32.Since these arrest rates match the frequency distribution of victims’ reports, they do not appear to reflect a bias in arrests. J. Philippe Rushton, “Race Differences in Behavior: A Review and Evolutionary Analysis,” Personality and Individual Differences 9 (1988): 1016 and Michael J. Hindelang, “Race and Involvement in Common Personal Crime, American Sociological Review 4 (1978): 100-101.

9. I would like to thank Jim Sterba for these responses.

10. One estimate of the efficiency losses of current laws banning race discrimination, including enforcement, compliance costs, and opportunity costs, puts the costs in 1991 at 4% of the gross national product. Peter Brimelow and Leslie Spencer, “When Quotas Replace Merit, Everybody Suffers,” Forbes, Feb. 15, 1993, v. 151 no. 4 p. 8. This is equal to a $418 billion loss in 2002 dollars.

11. I am grateful to Carl Cohen and Jim Sterba for their extremely helpful comments and criticisms of this review.