African American Contributions to the Americas' Cultures: A Critical Edition of Lectures of Alain Locke

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Jacoby Adeshei Carter, African American Contributions to the Americas' Cultures: A Critical Edition of Lectures of Alain Locke, Palgrave Macmillan, 2016, 184pp., $89.99 (hbk), ISBN 9781137525185.

Reviewed by Johnny Washington, Missouri State University


Jacoby Adeshei Carter's book makes a great contribution to the study of Alain Locke as philosopher. It has two parts, the first is "The Negro's Contributions to the Culture of the Americas"; the second is "'Like Rum in the Punch': The Quest for Cultural Democracy." Part I includes six lectures Locke delivered while living in Haiti during 1943. During this time, he was an Inter-American Exchange Professor to Haiti. Over the years, I have published three books focusing on Locke's works. My research required that I visit the Moorland-Spingarn Research Center (MSRC) at Howard University. While conducting research there, I was not aware of the six lectures included in Carter's book. Thus, it merits pointing out that Carter is providing a great service to the academic world by bringing these lectures to the light of day. However, I am unpleasantly surprised that Carter seemed to have overlooked my publications on Locke. My Alain Locke and Philosophy: A Quest for Cultural Pluralism (1986) is the first major philosophic work ever written on Locke's philosophy. In my second book, A Journey into the Philosophy of Alain Locke (1994), I devoted a chapter to "African Americans' Cultural Contributions to the Three Americas." The chapter title itself is telling. Its theme is comparable to the overall focus of Carter's book.

As to the organization of Carter's book, it seemed to me that its title and subtitle are reversed. Since the book is mainly about the works of Alain Locke, Carter's title could have been more illuminating if he had expressed the title along these lines: A Critical Edition of Lectures by Alain Locke: African Americans' Contributions to the Americas. Moreover, it seemed that Carter should have placed Locke's lectures in Part II and provided his own commentary in Part I. It would have been instructive if Carter would have made a greater effort to compare or contrast Locke's views with those of Marcus Garvey, one of Locke's contemporaries. Just as Locke was concerned with the identities of the people of African origins, so was Garvey.

As I first began reading the book, I was under the impression that Carter himself was discussing Locke's lectures. Moreover, Carter states repeatedly that Locke was a pragmatist. But Carter never adequately defines pragmatism. Nor did Locke do so. He rarely identified himself with pragmatism. If Locke were a pragmatist, how did his philosophy reflect the pragmatism of Charles S. Peirce, William James or John Dewey? In his brief biographical sketch, Locke expressed his ambivalence or paradoxical attitude towards pragmatism:

Philadelphia, with her birthright of provincialism flavored by urbanity and her petty bourgeois psyche with the Tory slant, at the start set the key of paradox; circumstance compounded it by decreeing me as a Negro a dubious and doubting sort of American and by reason of the racial inheritance making me more of a pagan than of a Puritan, more of a humanist than a pragmatist. (Cited in my book, Alain Locke and Philosophy, p. xxvii)

From this passage, it is evident that Locke was ambivalent towards pragmatism, an ambivalence he expressed in terms of a paradox. Carter did not call sufficient attention to such a paradox. Although Dewey never explicitly stated it, I suspect he himself was ambivalent towards pragmatism. This becomes evident as he vacillated in his attitude towards American democracy and socialism. Locke went on to say: "Verily paradox has followed me the rest of my days: at Harvard, clinging to the genteel tradition of Palmer, Royce and Munsterberg, yet attracted to the disillusion of Santayana and the radical protest of James." (Ibid.)

My previously mentioned books, taken together, laid the foundation for what at times was often called Black Philosophy. They also opened the field of Alain Locke philosophic studies. These two books were complemented by my third book, Evolution, History and Destiny: Letters to Alain Locke (1886-1954) and Others (2002), in which I introduced the notion of Destiny, intended to inspire among other things racial or ethnic cohesion worldwide. I pointed out in the above-mentioned chapter, "African Americans' Cultural Contributions to the Americas", that when Locke discussed racial cohesion, he in part evoked the notion of an elite. In the US, due to what Locke called a prior prejudice, the Black elite is pre-judged as not suitable for acceptance in the larger, white society. This was because the elite was associated with the Black masses, characterized by overt prejudice. The Black elite was not allowed to standout and lead.

Rather, the elite was thrown back upon the masses from which it led and in which a degree of unity was manifest. (Apparently Dr. King and President Obama transcended this elite problem; they broke through what Henri Bergson called the closed society.) Locke said that the situation was different in Latin America. It had no racial elite. Rather, economics, more so than race, was the pressing problem affecting the elite as well as the masses in Latin America. Unlike Locke, Carter does not do an adequate job in distinguishing the Blacks in Latin America from the Blacks in the US. A distinguishing feature of Blacks in Latin America, more so than the US. Blacks, is: Blacks in Latin America were influenced by Catholicism. Moreover, Liberation Theology had a great influence on Latin Americans. This is not the case for Blacks in the US. Both Catholicism and Liberation Theology provided cohesiveness in Latin America, a point that Carter largely sidesteps. I am uncertain as to why he did so. Locke recognized Christianity as an institution, along with Slavery and the Plantation, enabling Blacks in the US to be partly included into Western civilization.

Pragmatism in its traditional sense was mainly an epistemology, according to which the meaning of a belief or an hypothesis is determined by its practical consequences. Locke's philosophic works focused almost exclusively on axiology, aesthetics, ethics, education and racial matters. How do these subject-matters relate to epistemology in the context of Locke's pragmatism? Further when Carter writes about pragmatism, he makes it seem that certain scholars throughout the Americas were pragmatists as well. Where is the evidence for such a claim? It is not clear to me how pragmatism can be applied in addressing racial problems throughout the Americas. This might be an approach if one tied cultural relativism or racialism to pragmatism, but Locke never fully worked out the connections between or among these notions

It is ironic that in the latter part of the book, Carter quotes Locke to remind us of Locke's approach which in effect alluded to the need to address broader societal problems:

[t]his approach also links up the effort to benefit the Negro and right his group injustices with all the national campaigns for practical and progressive democracy, such as the movements for better popular education, wider use of the franchise, labor rights, social security, farm reconstruction, civic improvement of sub-standard housing and living generally. (p.164)

When Locke wrote the above passage, it is likely that he had in mind the African Americans in the US. An approach to these problems is more pressing in the other two Americas and the Caribbean than in the US. A nagging question is whether the Latin American political and economic infrastructures are adequate in allowing leaders in these countries to address these problems effectively.

Like Peirce, Dewey attempted to ground his version of pragmatism in what he called the scientific method. To the extent that scientific method is among the tools scientists rely on in investigating physical, social or psychological nature, it may have been fruitful as an instrument in conducting cross-cultural research throughout the Americas and beyond. Yet, I doubt whether the scientific method alone would engender unity among the diverse ethnic groups in this hemisphere. As was suggested, democratic socialism is another principle that Dewey attempted to link to pragmatism. In the early part of his career, he attempted to unite the two approaches. Democratic socialism, if it had caught on, might have addressed certain societal problems in the broadest sense. Dewey was regarded as a socialist by the people on the right. Not only that, but some of his critics saw Dewey as a communist. It will be remembered that Dewey defended Trotsky against the power struggle between Trotsky and Stalin. Dewey wanted to employ socialism to the economic crises that the US economy was undergoing in the 1920s and the 1930s. Democratic socialism had the potential to spread throughout the Western Hemisphere. Carter, and to a lesser extent Locke, seem to have had little, if any, compelling interest in connecting economic issues to the problems of race and culture. However, Locke did so in passing when considering the above-mentioned societal problems in Latin America.

It is the case that when I wrote my first book, I made the claim that Locke's philosophy was informed by the teachings of Socrates and pragmatism. However, I never tried to show how Locke's views in these regards were adequate in addressing racial problems throughout the Americas. As was mentioned, Peirce, James or Dewey devoted little, if any, attention to racial problems. Keep in mind that the Western Hemisphere has diverse cultures, histories and ethnic groups. Language barriers make it difficult to establish cross-cultural understanding, a project with which both Locke and Carter were engaged. Admittedly the Internet and other digital devices make cross-cultural communication easier than it was several decades ago. Yet, the language barriers are still in place. If the Internet and other social media outlets have enabled us to strengthen cross-cultural ties, they also tend to excite divisiveness within and among cultural groups. Terrorists, for example, rely heavily on digital technologies.

Both Locke and Carter were interested in exploring the commonalities and diversities among people of African origin. To fulfill such an ambitious objective, an overarching, transcendent principle is needed, a principle that will inspire hope among the people of African origin. This, however, is the subject of another book. Insofar as the people in the Americas and around the world are undergoing immigration crises, Carter's book is timely.

Carters' book is also significant in this regard: he begins by situating Locke in Haiti where he gave a series of lectures. Today Haiti is one of the poorest countries in this hemisphere. It is instructive that both Locke and Carter focused our attention on Haiti whose economic plight serves as a litmus test as to how developed countries regard undeveloped countries. This is another reason why Carter's book merits our attention.

The book has one striking typo: on page 45, it was stated that Fredrick Douglass escaped from slavery in 1945. In the next edition, this needs to be corrected.