After Certainty: A History of Our Epistemic Ideals and Illusions

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Robert Pasnau, After Certainty: A History of Our Epistemic Ideals and Illusions, Oxford University Press, 2017, 384pp., $70.00, ISBN 9780198801788.

Reviewed by Sydney Penner, Asbury University


Pasnau's previous book is the ambitious and hefty Metaphysical Themes 1274-1671; his latest book is, if anything, even more ambitious, covering the history of epistemology from Aristotle to the present day. Here, however, the main text is a mere 138 pages.[1] Its chief virtues are therefore predictable: a stimulating, readable synopsis of more than two millennia of epistemological thought painted in broad strokes that are clearly discernible without the distraction of too much detail. The concomitant vices are equally predictable. If one disagrees with Pasnau's interpretation of a given figure, the detailed engagement with primary texts and argumentation that might move one towards his interpretation is unlikely to be found. The virtues of the book, however, are sufficiently strong for me to wholeheartedly recommend it to anyone with an interest in the history of epistemology.

As noted, part of what makes this an ambitious project is the breadth of history covered. The key figures making repeated appearances are Aristotle, Aquinas, Scotus, Ockham, Buridan, Descartes, Locke, and Hume, but numerous other figures fill out the cast. The serious, informed discussion of medieval authors is especially valuable. But Pasnau's ambition goes well beyond telling the story of how we get from Aristotle to contemporary epistemology. He also means to diagnose what is wrong with contemporary epistemology and to offer remedies. He finds current preoccupations with analyzing knowledge misguided at best, and thinks we should return to what he calls idealized epistemology, but argues that the ideals to which we clung for most of our history are unattainable. Nevertheless, he ends by recommending hope.

The book's origin lies in the Isaiah Berlin Lectures on the History of Ideas that Pasnau delivered at Oxford in 2014, and it retains something of that form, including being divided into six lectures. After briefly summarizing the lectures, I will raise some questions and concerns.

In the introductory lecture, Pasnau argues that, of all the main branches of philosophy, epistemology is the most alienated from its history. For most of philosophical history, there was no separate branch of philosophy corresponding to what we call epistemology. Furthermore, while some clearly epistemological topics were included in what was traditionally known as logic, there is little precedent for the preoccupation with analyzing knowledge that one finds in contemporary analytic epistemology. Instead, Pasnau argues, idealized epistemology dominated our history. Rather than analyzing knowledge, philosophers tried to describe the epistemic ideals to which human beings can aspire. Pasnau argues at some length that reading Aristotle's Posterior Analytics as providing an analysis of what ordinary Greek speakers meant by 'epistēmē' leads to all manner of puzzles, starting with the fact that attaining epistēmē as described looks impossible in most domains. But, he argues, these puzzles dissolve if we understand Aristotle as describing an epistemic ideal that we should aspire to but ordinarily fall short of in one way or another. The pursuit of epistemic ideals continues through the modern period, but the replacement of traditional Aristotelian metaphysics and natural philosophy with the precise mathematical methods of modern science requires rearticulating the ideals. In the process, philosophy becomes a handmaiden to science, making epistemology increasingly ascendant.

In the second lecture, Pasnau describes the central role that certainty plays as an epistemic ideal in medieval philosophy. Certainty has a subjective side (the believer being fully confident with no doubt) and an objective side (the thing believed being a stable object of knowledge, typically requiring being necessary in some sense or other). Evidentness (in Latin, evidentia, but typically not exactly what we normally call evidence in English) is the bridge that connects the objectively certain and the subjectively certain. A central question becomes what propositions count as evident, since it is evidentness that yields certainty and certainty that yields scientia (again, not exactly what we ordinarily mean by either 'science' or 'knowledge'). This picture, Pasnau says, is overthrown in the seventeenth century. The conceptual tools had already been put in place by Buridan, but it is only with the rejection of Aristotelian natural philosophy -- in particular, its account of essences -- that philosophers replace certainty as an epistemic ideal with the principle of proportionality. Philosophers make their peace with mere probability rather than certainty with a new norm that says that beliefs should be proportioned to their evidence. Pasnau emphasizes that the Lockean abandonment of certainty does not result in widespread skepticism -- as might be expected if the accounts of scientia had been meant as analyses analogous to contemporary analyses of knowledge -- but rather results in a revision of epistemic ideals.

Even the most optimistic Aristotelian does not think certainty is available everywhere, and even pessimistic modern philosophers usually think there are some privileged domains where certainty is on offer. Consequently, much attention has been devoted to trying to establish precisely where such privileged domains are to be found. Medieval Aristotelians, for example, argue that there are causally efficacious sensible qualities in the world, e.g., colours, that are the proper objects of the senses, and that the senses are reliable with respect to these proper sensibles. The mechanical philosophy of the seventeenth century undercuts such Aristotelian realism, leading to the way of ideas, according to which the direct objects of perception are ideas, and these ideas -- rather than something external -- are the privileged domain. Lectures three and four concern attempts to find a privileged domain with respect to the senses, and lecture five concerns the possibility of a privileged domain -- the privileged now -- with respect to the intellect. For the sake of space, I will not say much about these lectures, though there is much of interest in them. For example, Pasnau has an illuminating discussion in lecture four of the argument from illusions, in which he explains why medieval philosophers do not regard illusions as a good reason to adopt the way of ideas while modern philosophers often do so regard it.

Throughout these lectures, Pasnau describes an "ongoing retrenchment" in our epistemic expectations. In the final lecture, he asks how bad things really are. His conclusion is that things are very bad as long as we hold on to traditional epistemic ideals. He argues that uncertainty is an inescapable part of cognition, arguing that not even God can attain certainty (and therefore is not available to give us certainty either). It gets worse. Pasnau is not convinced that even a reasonable degree of probability is available, and suggests that we should take epistemic defeatism seriously, namely, the view that there is no proposition for which we have good evidence in the final analysis. What response to this "dismal verdict" is appropriate? One response would be to hold propositions on faith. Pasnau regards such fideism as disreputable. Instead, he suggests taking inspiration from another of the traditional theological virtues: hope. Instead of elevating our credences in propositions, we should recognize our poor epistemic state but without fearing being wrong. We can live without cognitive confidence, yet with a cheery "optimism on the affective side."

Pasnau ends his book with hope, but permit me to end with some critical reflections. I am not convinced that skepticism is as uninteresting as Pasnau takes it to be. He insists that skepticism is an absurd overreaction even to the dismal verdict of lecture six. On his view, it is simply a mistake first to set some sort of ideal as a threshold for knowledge, and then, on discovering that we cannot meet that threshold, conclude that we lack knowledge. It is, as he puts it, "perfectly useful and apt to be able to say . . . that people know one thing or another" (p. 125). Consequently, any plausible account of knowledge needs to be sensitive to what is actually possible for us. Certainty necessarily eludes us, but we may nevertheless claim to know things.

I wonder, though, if the connection between knowledge and certainty is not too deeply embedded to sever the link so easily. The link between knowledge and certainty is not merely an artifact of a misguided philosophical tradition. Furthermore, why proscribe claims to certainty but permit claims to knowledge? Are not both kinds of claims equally useful? I am reminded of an incident a few years ago when I was flying out of Schiphol, and the officer at the security check interrogated me at greater length than usual: "Are you absolutely certain that no one had access to your bags? Is there any possibility that someone could have put something in without your noticing?" I had no trouble thinking of a number of metaphysically possible scenarios in which that might have happened, and I was pretty sure that with a few more moments of reflection I could even come up with some physically possible scenarios. But I assured him that there was no possibility, even though I felt like I was lying. Still, is not the officer's use of the term 'certain' just as useful and apt as our claims to knowledge? It seems to me, then, that the more stable approach would be either to also grant believers a kind of certainty or to take skepticism more seriously.

Complaining about figures absent from Pasnau's historical story may seem insufficiently appreciative of the fact that he already provides much better coverage than usual. Nevertheless, there are absences worth noting. Aside from several references to Suárez, early modern scholastics are largely invisible, which matters for Pasnau's account of the seventeenth century as one of revolutionary change in epistemology. He might seem to be comparing medieval and early modern figures, but he is really comparing medieval Aristotelians to early modern anti-Aristotelians. Including seventeenth and eighteenth century scholastics might attenuate the picture of the seventeenth century as revolutionary. It would certainly complicate the claim that the epistemological changes are grounded in a rejection of Aristotelian natural philosophy.

Along the same lines, what role does probabilism -- the view that moral agents may follow a probable opinion even if another opinion is more probable -- play in what Pasnau describes as the "growing tolerance for the merely probable" (p. 22)? Here is a sentence from the preface to Stefania Tutino's recent history of probabilism:

probabilism became the venue in which early modern Catholic intellectuals examined fundamental epistemological questions, such as the nature of probability as opposed to certainty and the relationship between knowledge and moral responsibility. (2018: ix)

Knowledge, certainty, probability. One might think that Tutino and Pasnau are covering the same ground, yet there is almost no overlap in their respective histories (they might profitably be read in conjunction). Granted, there are various complications in relating a discussion that grew out of moral theology to the discussions Pasnau covers, but probabilism features prominently in early modern thought, appears relevant to what Pasnau discusses, and, again, raises questions about his claim that the epistemological changes result from changes in natural philosophy, especially since probabilism predates the canonical early modern philosophers.

He is perhaps not the most representative probabilist, but the Cistercian polymath Juan Caramuel y Lobkowitz (1606-1682) would be of particular interest. He only makes one brief appearance by way of a second-hand quotation in Pasnau's book, but his view seems congenial to Pasnau's. Caramuel takes uncertainty to be a general feature of human cognition, not just in moral matters. Aside from two exceptions -- the principle of noncontradiction and God's existence -- Caramuel advises that we stop claiming evidentness and content ourselves with probability. His own elegant formulation is an appropriate closing: "I saw most clearly that everything is obscure, and most certainly that everything is uncertain" (1652: 11).


Caramuel y Lobkowitz, Juan. Theologia moralis. Frankfurt, 1652.

Tutino, Stefania. Uncertainty in Post-Reformation Catholicism: A History of Probabilism. Oxford University Press, 2018.


[1] Let me say something about the format of the book. The main text makes up less than half the volume. Most of the remainder is made up of long endnotes, sometimes pages in length. Pasnau explains in the preface that readers should read the main text by itself, “on no account” attempting “the maddening exercise of paging back and forth.” I was unable to heed this advice. The little superscript numerals were simply too tantalizing, and, indeed, often led to great riches. The paging back and forth, however, was the promised maddening exercise. So, I laud the experimentation with form, but have mixed feelings about this particular result. I wonder if it might have been better to weave the notes into the main text but set off with a different typeface or some such device. That way they could still have been ignored, but would have left those of us unable to resist the temptation less mad.