After Gödel: Platonism and Rationalism in Mathematics and Logic

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Richard Tieszen, After Gödel: Platonism and Rationalism in Mathematics and Logic, Oxford University Press, 2011, 245pp., $75.00, ISBN 9780199606207.

Reviewed by Juliette Kennedy, University of Helsinki


This aptly titled book is the most recent in a series of books and papers by Richard Tieszen devoted to reading Gödel's key philosophical writings within the framework of Husserlian phenomenology. The motivation here is Gödel's late interest in, if not conversion to, Husserlian phenomenology, as witnessed by his 1961 (undelivered) lecture "The Modern Development of The Foundations of Mathematics in the Light of Philosophy," as well as by his remarks in conversation recorded by various interlocutors, Hao Wang principal among them. Both an enrichment and a fleshing out, this exploration of a philosophical road only partly taken by Gödel (as Tieszen readily admits) gives us Platonism construed phenomenologically.  Written by one of Husserl's -- and Gödel's -- most articulate and most knowledgeable interpreters, it is an important addition to the debate on issues of the ontology of mathematics.

In addition to its exegetical and historical aspects,Tieszen's book formulates and defends a view he calls "constituted Platonism." This is a view that seeks to reconcile, using Gödel's language from (e.g.) his 1961 lecture, the so-called "rightward" and "leftward" tendencies typical of 20th century ontology and metaphysics. As Tieszen puts it, this classification means, roughly speaking, the following: "If one thinks of philosophical doctrines as arranged along a line from left to right . . . then empiricism belongs on the left side and a priorism belongs on the right." (p. 69)

In this review we first consider constituted Platonism, before turning to the book's purely exegetical and historical aspects.

Tieszen argues that Husserlian phenomenology is fully compatible with, and indeed accepts, the seemingly a priori character of mathematical discourse, while at the same time it offers a way to sidestep metaphysical notions such as mind-independent existence in the strong sense (as Tieszen defines it on, e.g., p. 155), notions which have traditionally -- and problematically -- been offered up as accounting for this a priori character. The reason for this is bound up with the Husserlian world picture as given mainly in Husserl's Ideen I, a complex of ideas impossible to treat in this review beyond mentioning a few salient aspects. There is Husserl's account of the existence of abstract entities, entities that are to be understood in terms of the intention/fulfillment structure of consciousness, of what "persists across places, times and persons" as we reflect on our experience of doing mathematics.This is an experience which, seen in the proper light (that is, in the light of the phenomenological epoché), directs one incorrigibly toward the sense of such objects being constituted in a nonarbitrary and rationally motivated fashion. It is crucial for this view that the appearance/reality distinction remains valid (for us) from within the phenomenological epoché -- a technique, as it were, invented for the purpose of uncovering just what it is in our perceptual horizon towards which consciousness is genuinely, not just apparently, directed. This directedness toward existents is another salient point, and it is the fundamental property of consciousness on the Husserlian account. As Tieszen puts what one might call the first insight of Husserlian phenomenology: "Acts of reason exhibit intentionality." (p. 21)

In this way, as Tieszen so convincingly explains, Husserlian phenomenology changes the subject from ontological preoccupations of the type with which, e.g., Benacerraf's problem is concerned; namely, questions of how mathematical knowledge is possible, given that it is knowledge of acausal entities. This change is effected by eschewing the notion of absolute or, in Tieszen's sense, strongly mind-independent existence at stake in Benaceraff's (and related) problems. According to the phenomenological notion of mathematical existence, objects "are constituted non-arbitrarily . . . in the consciousness of the transcendental subject (monad)," (p. 154) the manner of constitution being one in which the transcendental ego builds up logic and mathematics "through founded acts of abstraction, idealization, reflection, variation, and so on" (p. 154-55).  On this view, the problem of access not only does not arise; Husserlian phenomenology actually builds in a solution to it.

Tieszen thus reports a qualified view from the right, but he also emphasizes constituted Platonism's compatibility with forms of empiricism consistent with (certain forms of) idealism, if not, in fact, arealism. This comes from Tieszen's inclusion of the Kantian idea -- an idea updated by Husserl -- that the world as it is, that is, the world of things-in-themselves, is not one to which we have access, "According to constituted Platonism," Tieszen says, "we can never get outside of appearances to things-in-themselves." (p. 199) The field of abstract objects that mathematical practice deals with, then, is composed of artifacts of subjective (but nevertheless transcendental) mathematical consciousness, objects that, as such, do not reach the threshold of existence in the absolute sense. Constituted Platonism is thus a softened form of Platonism -- in fact readers with an "either/or" cast of mind may doubt if it is a form of Platonism at all.

For readers fluent in the language and literature of phenomenology (modulo disagreements on matters of interpretation that may very likely arise among specialists), the book delivers a careful and coherent "completion," so to speak, of Gödel's remarks on Husserl, in addition to the new view, constituted Platonism. On the other hand readers with little experience of phenomenology will also find Tieszen's book valuable, giving as it does a brilliantly clear explanation of Husserlian phenomenology together with an application of it to the main philosophical problems (traditionally) associated with the mathematical enterprise.

Of course, some readers remain unsatisfied by phenomenology. So given the fact that Tieszen's analysis of Gödel's writings and remarks on Husserlian phenomenology, as well as his presentation of constituted Platonism are so deeply embedded in the language and theory of Ideen I, Tieszen's solution of, or more precisely avoidance of, e.g. Benacerraf's problem, will fail to convince. But in that case Tieszen's anti-reductionism, in particular his recommendation that philosophers of mind, philosophically motivated neuroscientists, and the like become engaged with the problem of consciousness in a way which fully recognizes the importance of the concept of intentionality, remains apt and important. Tieszen is recommending that the language of phenomenology, if not the whole phenomenological framework, be brought into neuroscience. And there is perhaps conversely a message here to phenomenologists as well: that they should modernize Husserl's view (in the light of experimental neuroscience), just as Husserl modernized Kant's work, as Gödel notes in his 1961 lecture. Of course, the modernization of Husserl's writings is very much a going concern nowadays, and this is at least partly due to Tieszen's work.

Tieszen does not pull any punches, and this is altogether a good thing, at least in the opinion of this reviewer. Others may disagree. For example, section one of chapter five, "Mathematical knowledge and a scandal in the philosophy of mind," is a generalized polemic against behaviorists, computational functionalists, neuroscientific reductionists and the like.  Some may find this overly polemical and at the same time giving too scant an account of the particular research on consciousness that Tieszen finds so inadequate. But perhaps this is too much to ask of a book that reshapes the rather extensive though scattered documents we have relating to Gödel and phenomenology, while also sketching out an independent realist view -- an enormous undertaking, to say the least.

The book's title, "After Gödel," is appropriate. As Tieszen mentions at the end, it would be difficult to defend the claim that the view laid out here would have been Gödel's view, had Gödel troubled to commit himself in print on the matter in his last years.

Still, the exegetical question remains. What one can say is this: Judging from his 1961 lecture, Gödel seemed to have been very taken with Husserl's idea of philosophie als strenge wissenschaft -- and this should come as no surprise, given that the idea also informs, if not completely characterizes, Gödel's own project. From his so-called Dialectica lecture of 1958 (as well as many other writings), we can see that Gödel was also very taken with the idea of analyzing mathematical practice from within, so to speak, by reflecting on our own meaning constituting acts, and with developing the "subjective picture," as he called it in conversation with Hao Wang. These ideas are of course beautifully worked out in Husserl's writings (and beautifully explained here), and there is no question that Gödel expressed his appreciation of those writings on many occasions.

At the end of the day though, how committed was Gödel to Husserlian phenomenology? It is important to note that Gödel's 1961 lecture (a strong endorsement of the view) was not included on either of the two lists found in the Nachlass, entitled "Was Ich publizieren könnte" ("What I could publish"). Also, Gödel's 1975 remarks to the proof theorist Sue Toledo[1] indicate an enthusiastic but nevertheless somewhat qualified attitude toward phenomenology.[2] Finally, Gödel was a voracious reader of philosophy altogether, so to the extent that reading Gödel as a genuine phenomenologist depends to any serious extent on his study of Husserl, and/or on his remarks in conversation with interlocutors who conducted those conversations according to their own interests, judgment on this point should perhaps be left open.

Tieszen is thus completely correct in leaving the problem of exegesis aside, formulating instead an independent view, using Gödel's phenomenological forays as a starting point. As he remarks about his project at the end of his book:

It is an attempt to develop, after Gödel, a defensible version of platonistic rationalism that is based on Gödel's ideas about using Husserl's transcendental phenomenology to preserve in a new and updated combination some central elements of Plato's rudimentary objectivism, Leibniz's rationalism, and Kant's transcendental philosophy.

[1] See "Sue Toledo's Notes of her Conversations with Gödel in 1972-5" by Sue Toledo, in the collection Set Theory, Arithmetic, and Foundations of Mathematics: Theorems, Philosophies (Cambridge).

[2] The translation of Gödel's so-called "Maxphil Notebooks" from the Gabelsberger shorthand, a project led by Gabriella Crocco and in which Tieszen is an important participant, may very well shed light on important exegetical matters such as these. See "Gödel philosopher, from logic to cosmology" ANR BLA-09-13-03.