After Injury: A Historical Anatomy of Forgiveness, Resentment and Apology

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Ashraf H. A. Rushdy, After Injury: A Historical Anatomy of Forgiveness, Resentment and Apology, Oxford University Press, 2018, 288pp., $34.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780190851972.

Reviewed by Christopher Bennett, University of Sheffield


The topics covered in this book -- forgiveness, resentment and apology -- have been undergoing something of a revival in philosophical interest over the past twenty or thirty years. However, as can often happen, the growth in intensity of philosophical scrutiny has corresponded to a growth in the abstractness of the examples that are meant to underpin the theorising. Examples that call to mind the rich field of experience to which philosophers' schemata are meant to be adequate are rare. It would introduce a more complex set of examples, and hence a more adequate set of data for philosophers to exercise their minds over, if those working on these topics drew on a wider range of experience, and hence did more to inform their discussions by looking at how cognate disciplines such as history, literature, sociology and psychology can shed light on these issues. For this reason, it is welcome to read a book like Ashraf Rushdy's, which helps us to see the social, historical and cultural context in which philosophical debates about forgiveness, resentment and apology are set. Although my review will not be uncritical, I think what Rushdy is trying to do here is very important, and I wish more philosophers would take the same open and curious interest in the variety of ethical phenomena rather than narrowing the discussions down to simpler and allegedly more tractable schemata.

First of all, then, let me summarise what Rushdy sets out to achieve in this book. This is not entirely straightforward. While in some respects his book is an antidote to the restrictive, abstract nature of some philosophical theorising, it would have benefited from a greater degree of philosophical clarity about its argumentative strategy. This is a point to which we will return. But the basic idea is that Rushdy devotes the three parts of the book in turn to forgiveness, resentment and apology, with three chapters on each topic, and that each of these chapters deals, not so much with how to define or interpret or evaluate these phenomena as philosophers would (although Rushdy's discussion proceeds with an awareness of philosophical debates over these issues), but with key historical moments in which the current philosophical understanding of those topics was formed.

In the discussion of forgiveness, for instance, one of the things Rushdy is at pains to do is to distinguish two different interpretations of forgiveness from the beginnings of the Christian tradition, on the one hand that of Jesus, and on the other that of Paul. The rationale for concentrating on early Christianity is that Christianity is a major world religion that holds God's forgiveness of sins as a central doctrine. It can therefore be thought to have had a great influence on our understanding of this topic (in particular the 'common-sense' of Western countries). Rushdy quotes Jesus as saying, 'when you stand praying, forgive, if ye have aught against any: that your Father also which is in heaven may forgive you your trespasses. But if you do not forgive, neither will your Father, which is in Heaven forgive your trespasses.' (Mark 11: 25-26) As Rushdy argues, this suggests a view on which a) human beings can forgive interpersonally independently of being forgiven themselves by God, and b) on which human beings will be forgiven by God only if they exercise their own human powers of forgiveness. On Jesus's view, then, interpersonal forgiveness is within our power, but divine forgiveness must be earned by interpersonally forgiving. On Rushdy's reading of Paul, however, he denies both of these points. For Paul, divine forgiveness is given independently of our exercise of interpersonal forgiveness, and it is only by virtue of having been forgiven by God that we have the ability to forgive interpersonally. Rushdy draws this interpretation of Paul from Ephesians 4:32: 'be ye kind to one another, tender-hearted, forgiving one another, even as God for Christ's sake hath forgiven you' and Colossians 3:13, 'even as Christ forgave you, so also do ye'. And this, Rushdy claims, is important for contemporary debates about the possibility of forgiveness, where he looks at the way in which critical, even mystical, interventions from John Milbank, Vladimir Jankelevitch and Jacques Derrida all seem to assume something like the Pauline model in making the impossibility of forgiving (without God) central to their claims.

In the discussion of resentment, Rushdy's key historical moments are a) the development of an idea of resentment as an emotion functioning as a largely beneficial response to injustice in the eighteenth-century tradition of British moralism (especially Joseph Butler and Adam Smith), and b) the development of a destructive conception of resentment more closely related to envy, and often identified as a collective attitude among a certain group (the weak, the poor, the unlucky) in the nineteenth- and early twentieth-century tradition of Dostoevsky, Kierkegaard, Max Scheler and, in particular, Nietzsche. These historical developments, Rushdy claims, underpin a modern political conception of resentment, different from the other two (though in truth this conception is not made out in any satisfactory level of detail). There is also a chapter that deals with the nature of resentment as it functions symbolically in Sophocles's Philoctetes (in the shape of Philoctetes's festering wound -- though it seems to me an interesting question whether the conception of symbolism Rushdy reads into this play was available to the Ancient Greeks).

In the discussion of apology, the key historical moment is the 1960s, where distinct but not unrelated approaches were developed by John Austin and Erving Goffman. In regard to Austin, one point of Rushdy's interest is whether the condition of sincerity on felicitous apologising can be squared with Austin's insistence that we do not need to appeal to any internal action or state in order to understand the effect of speech acts. Rushdy then has a chapter each on private and public apologies, arguing that a sure way for the latter to go wrong in various ways is to model them too closely on the former. This section also has a chapter in which Rushdy claims -- not entirely convincingly -- that the films The Unforgiven and The Lives of Others contain illuminating perspectives on apology, forgiveness and justice.

This overview hopefully gives some sense of the richness and ambition of the book, and the extent to which it departs from the ahistorical and non-literary approach to these issues that is common in analytic philosophy. However, while this richness is admirable and stimulating, I did sometimes wish that more of the virtues of analytic philosophy had been applied to the issues raised by the discussion. It is not entirely clear, for instance, why Rushdy selects the particular historical moments he does, or what the overall purpose of his 'historical anatomy' is meant to be and how he takes it to contribute to our philosophical understanding of these topics. We can illustrate this by looking at his discussion of forgiveness. Having criticised the Pauline conception of forgiveness across two chapters, Rushdy drops a hint about the possible shape of a more adequate understanding of forgiveness: see the brief discussion of Hannah Arendt on pp. 59-60. Rather than directly developing such a more adequate understanding, however, he turns in the succeeding chapter to the somewhat different question of the relation between forgiveness and retribution, and whether forgiveness is conditional on repentance (this is identified as the retributive position) or unconditional.

There are a number of problems with this move, which are somewhat characteristic of Rushdy's approach as a whole. One is that Rushdy gives no explicit indication of why he sees this chapter as the right one to follow the criticism of Paul in the development of his overall argument. Why not explore an Arendtian view in more detail? Indeed, it is not clear what the overall argument of this section on forgiveness is meant to be. Rushdy conducts the discussion of forgiveness vs retribution apparently in isolation from the discussion of Paul vs Jesus, and does not explain what we are meant to learn from their juxtaposition, or how we might build up a coherent and more adequate picture from these various interlocking debates. Furthermore, his discussion of forgiveness and retribution does not argue for conclusions about the adequacy of the views surveyed there. He says that he does not intend to argue either that the 'retributive' and 'unconditionalist' views are incompatible or that they can be made compatible; or that one or other conception is superior. Rather what he aims to do is to

reveal the inner workings of both models, and then to examine what those premises imply about the vision of the world each model embodies -- its focus on mercy or justice, obviously, but also its ideals about what set of behaviors, focused patiently inwardly, or expectantly outwardly, it upholds as the more desirable in that world. (pp. 88-9)

I agree that this hermeneutic approach can have value. But a risk in such an approach will always be that one neglects the variety of ways in which the conditional or unconditional view can be construed in order to insist on a fundamental difference of approach, e.g. where one is 'patient' and 'inward' and the other 'expectant' and 'outward.' And Rushdy sometimes gives us only a broad-brush understanding of a position or a debate that does not do justice to its philosophical interest or potential. For instance, it does not seem to me adequate to the 'retributive' position on forgiveness to characterise it as involving an 'intense focus on social exchange' or to say that its main problem is that according to this position forgiveness 'becomes a contractual process that in meaningful ways is determined by the wrongdoer' (p. 87). Indeed, whether one or another view is justified will in part depend on what we mean by forgiveness (or apology or resentment), and Rushdy does not follow the typical philosopher's tactic of starting off by defining her terms. However, the result of all this is that Rushdy does not tend to engage as directly as he might with what philosophers have been trained to regard as the main issues in any discussion of a topic like that of forgiveness -- for instance, the adequacy of some conception of what it is, how it works, and what value it has. Thus it remains a bit unclear what consequences he thinks his discussion has for the contemporary debate.

Rushdy could also have done more to explore the philosophically interesting issues that his discussions bring to light. For instance, Paul and Jesus seem to have different views about whether forgiveness needs to be earned (in its divine version, but perhaps also correspondingly in its interpersonal version). For Jesus, divine forgiveness is earned, since we are only forgiven if we forgive others. This is interesting, because it makes forgiveness conditional but not, as most of the recent philosophical debate has taken it, conditional on the wrongdoer's repentance. Or again: for Paul interpersonal forgiveness is something that we have powers to do only because we have been forgiven by God -- but Rushdy could have done more to help us see how we should understand that claim. One way of understanding it is that in forgiving us God invests us with certain powers. But which powers would this involve? One thing forgiveness requires might be psychological resources of commitment and determination, and this, it might be said, is not something we can simply choose to have, or bring about by our own will. It requires luck or providence, and thus it might be argued that we only have the ability to forgive if God gives us these psychological resources. Another possibility is that forgiveness requires normative powers such as authority, and it is God who has given us these normative powers because he himself values forgiveness. This gives us two different interpretations of the claim that our ability to forgive can be construed as dependent on something like grace.

Of course, no one book can cover all of the pertinent issues on any topic. But sometimes Rushdy gets distracted by less compelling issues, and not all of the space in the book is well spent. To stick with the discussion of forgiveness, one example of this comes up in Rushdy's discussion of Jesus and Paul. He claims that Jesus's position raises a problem of instrumentalism about interpersonal forgiveness: it encourages us to forgive only that we might be forgiven. He also claims that Paul's position faces the problem that it invites us to a blasphemous imitation of God's powers. However, the space Rushdy devotes to these issues does not seem to be justified by their urgency, since it is not clear that either of these problems is germane to his main concerns in the forgiveness section, and furthermore both problems seem to admit of fairly straightforward solutions. In the case of Paul, Rushdy himself acknowledges an alternative interpretation when he introduces Paul's view -- that we do not claim to have God's powers, but that we try to follow his example as the epitome of the Good. And the alleged problem of instrumentalism as applied to Jesus's view seems to be only an instance of a general problem about divine punishment and reward that need not be insurmountable. It might look as though any cosmology in which the prospect of reward is held out for virtuous conduct risks encouraging instrumental motives. But that does not mean that instrumentalism is mandated or endorsed by that cosmology. Jesus could reasonably be construed as saying only that interpersonal forgiveness is a necessary condition of forgiveness, not that we should forgive (only) in order to be forgiven.

Rushdy has written an important and engaging book that helps us to see the social, historical and cultural context in which philosophical debates about forgiveness, resentment and apology are set. I hope that philosophers read it and learn from it, and that it stimulates further attempts to bring history, sociology, the arts and philosophy into productive debate.