After Physicalism

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Benedikt Paul Göcke (ed.), After Physicalism, University of Notre Dame Press, 2012, 371pp., $42.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780268030001.

Reviewed by Stephen Biggs, Iowa State University


After Physicalism includes essays exploring non-physicalist approaches to minds and persons. The essays, new with the exception of contributions by Alvin Plantinga and Richard Swinburne, counter physicalism and develop alternative, non-physicalist theories. More specifically, Plantinga, Swinburne, and Uwe Meixner argue that minds are not physical, Plantinga and Benedikt Paul Göcke argue that persons are not physical, E.J. Lowe and John Foster develop non-physicalist theories of minds and persons, while Göcke develops a non-physicalist theory of persons only. William Hasker argues that the only plausible version of physicalism is nearly equivalent to the most plausible version of dualism. Howard Robinson and A.D. Smith explore theories of the sort that David Chalmers (elsewhere) labels "type-F monism". Stephen Priest argues that commonplace but misguided habits lead people to accept physicalism. Finally, Thomas Schartl develops an account of personal identity that, he thinks, both avoids problems that plague standard dualist theories and accounts for resurrection as conceived in Christian theology. The essays are unified by a strong rejection of physicalism about minds and persons, at least as physicalism is standardly formulated. What follows gives readers a sense of the volume by offering critical commentary on several essays, before concluding with a few general comments about the epistemology of metaphysics. I begin with theory building before turning to arguments against physicalism.

Lowe's theory of persons, which is as much a theory of minds, holds that persons/minds are immaterial, psychological substances. Lowe responds to a familiar objection to this (so far) Cartesian view. The objection holds that one cannot recognize a repeated person if persons are non-physical substances, since one cannot perceive non-physical substances or their properties, which must be non-physical. Lowe counters that, pace Descartes, essentially non-physical substances can have physical properties, albeit contingently, which opens the possibility that one can perceive non-physical substances as directly as one perceives physical substances -- by perceiving their physical properties. This move contradicts Foster's argument for substance dualism. Foster supports the falsity of physicalism by rehearsing standard first-pass problems for behaviorism, functionalism, and type-identity theory, and then supports substance dualism by claiming that property dualism implausibly implies that a physical substance instantiates mental properties. This implication is implausible, he thinks, since physical and mental are such different kinds, which suggests that, pace Lowe, mental substances cannot have physical properties. Here, I side with Lowe. Unless objects are mere bundles of properties, objects and properties are quite different in kind. If properties are abstracta and objects are concreta, this difference doubles. Surely, nonetheless, dogs can be colored. Accordingly, the mere fact that mental and physical are different kinds does not show that an object of one kind cannot instantiate a property of the other.

While Lowe and Foster develop dualist theories, Smith claims to develop a version of physicalism. His essay, then, appears to be an odd fit for the volume. The theory he develops, however, is far from ordinary physicalism. On one familiar characterization, physicalism is false if any mental entity is fundamental. On another, physicalism is false if the concrete includes more than structure and dynamics. Smith holds that consciousness is fundamental and cannot be exhaustively characterized as structural and dynamical. More specifically, driven by the Russellian insights that inspire many versions of type-F monism, Smith holds that macro-experiences are the intrinsic natures of physical entities. Many philosophers, then, would think of Smith's theory as a version of dualism. Smith disagrees. He holds "that something is wholly physical if and only if all of its properties are ones that a non-conscious thing can possess" (p. 214). Since experiences meet this condition, he thinks, his theory is a version of physicalism. But consider this. Most physicalists, I suspect, think that physicalism vindicates two claims: first, neither minds nor mental properties are fundamental; second, ontologically, minds are to bodies (or nervous systems, brains, etc.) as other macro entities (e.g., cars, bodies, etc.) are to other micro entities (e.g., engines, cells, etc.): the former of each pair is "nothing over and above" the latter. Accordingly, if Smith's theory is a version of physicalism, then physicalism is orthogonal to the mind-body problem, and vis-à-vis the mind-body problem his theory should be classed with theories of Lowe, Foster, Plantinga, and so on, not with behaviorism, functionalism, and identity theory.

Although a few other essays build non-physicalist theories, I now turn to arguments against physicalism. Meixner offers an argument that is analogous to Moore's famous "two hands" refutation of idealism. On a common interpretation, Moore argues by demonstrating his hands and then inferring that idealism is false. Meixner argues by demonstrating his pain and then inferring that physicalism is false. While Meixner recognizes that Moore's argument (so interpreted) begs the question, he thinks his own does not. The crucial difference, he thinks, is that one can demonstrate non-physical hands but not non-mental pains. Despite this difference, Meixner's argument shares the fate of Moore's (so interpreted). Idealism holds that all fundamentals are mental, which is compatible with the existence of physical derivatives, such as hands. Physicalism holds that all fundamentals are non-mental, which is compatible with the existence of mental derivatives, such as pains. So, demonstrating a pain shows that physicalism is false only if it establishes that pains are fundamental. But demonstrating pain shows that pains are fundamental no more than demonstrating hands shows that hands are fundamental.

Rather than arguing directly against physicalism, Hasker argues that the most promising versions of dualism and physicalism are "near enough" to being equivalent (p. 197). These theories agree that conscious properties and substances emerge from biological activity, but disagree about whether each emergent substance is "composed of the particles of microphysics" à la emergent materialism or merely "generated and sustained by the biological organism" à la emergent dualism (p. 181). Hasker rightly emphasizes the oddity of treating haecceities as composites, as emergent materialism does, which gives some reason to prefer emergent dualism. He does little, however, to show that emergent materialism is the strongest version of physicalism. That said, he offers an argument against emergent materialism that generalizes: since ordinary subjects experience the "various components of the visual field . . . simultaneously", they function as unified wholes; since the brain (or nervous system, body, etc.) is a mere collection of parts, it cannot function as a unified whole; so, subjects are not brains (or nervous systems, bodies, etc.) (p. 189). Hasker never explains why functioning as a unified whole requires being a unified whole. The brain, moreover, may well be a unified whole -- which Hasker acknowledges but does not explore adequately. Some philosophers (e.g., Evan Thompson) treat the nervous system as more fundamental than its parts. I suspect, moreover, that few neuroscientists think that one could identify what function a brain region is contributing to by watching that region alone -- think of how many brain functions are attributed to similar patterns of activity in the anterior cingulate cortex, for example -- which suggests that they treat the brain as a unified whole.

Plantinga argues for dualism about both persons and minds. He argues for person-body dualism by suggesting that, since any person may exist without her body, no person is identical with her body. He supports the antecedent by noting that a wholesale, instantaneous replacement of every cell in a body with a type-identical cell would make for a new body but not a new person. This replacement makes for a new body because "speed kills" (p. 108). Speed kills because cells "must be integrated into the organism and assimilated by it" in order to become part of that organism, and integration and assimilation cannot occur until a new cell "has begun to play [the appropriate] causal role", prior to which a new cell is no more part of the organism than is a "goldfish you just swallowed, or a tapeworm" (p.108). One wonders, however, whether integration/assimilation requires actually playing a causal role or only being poised to play it. Suppose that my body contains cells that are present from birth but only begin playing their designated role when they encounter a particular sort of pathogen, which I first encounter at age forty. Plausibly, those cells are part of my body from birth and are so because they were poised to play a certain role at birth -- where being so poised requires being embedded in a context in which they will have their characteristic effect given the right input. Correspondingly, the instant new cells replace old cells they can be part of that same organism because they are poised to play the roles that their predecessors played.

Plantinga bases his argument for mind-body dualism on modal intuitions: it seems possible that consciousness could occur without any supporting physical activity, and it seems impossible that a wholly physical entity could have intrinsically intentional states or consciousness. Plantinga acknowledges that modal intuitions are defeasible, and thus, one might endorse physicalism despite these intuitions if "really powerful arguments" support it (p. 132). One might suspect, then, that Plantinga does not presuppose that intuitions are the ultimate arbiter of disputes about modal claims, and thus, if he successfully concludes that these intuitions undermine physicalism, his argument is especially effective.

But Plantinga simply ignores the most common undercutting defeaters for these intuitions; Brain Loar, and Murat Aydede and Guven Guzeldere argue, in effect, that even if modal intuitions are generally reliable, those directed at propositions about consciousness are not. Plantinga simply asserts, moreover, that the most common rebutting defeaters for these intuitions have no "force at all" (p. 132). So, for example, he thinks that the fact that certain possibilities "look obvious" (his italics p. 136) trumps any "splendid theoretical advantages" of identifying mental and neural properties (p. 141). Accordingly, Plantinga's acknowledgment that arguments supporting physicalism could trump dualist modal intuitions is not what it seems; he proceeds as if, in the face of contravening modal intuitions, theoretical advantages are irrelevant to assessing modal claims, as if only modal intuitions supporting physicalism could defeat modal intuitions supporting dualism. Despite his apparent flexibility, then, Plantinga's reasoning presupposes that intuition is the ultimate arbiter of modal disputes, not just one source of evidence among others. He offers no motivation for this presupposition except to say that philosophy cannot proceed without intuition -- a dubious claim that, even if true, would not establish his presupposition.

Swinburne's semantic argument relies on a technical device, informative designators. A rigid designator is an expression that designates the same entity or entities in all possible worlds. A rigid designator is informative only if any competent user knows (perhaps implicitly) the right kind of set of necessary and sufficient conditions for application of the designator. Informative designators are "logically equivalent" just in case "they are associated with logically equivalent sets of necessary and sufficient conditions" (p. 151). Swinburne thinksthat "it is a purely a priori matter (a matter of logical entailment) whether one informatively designated property supervenes on other informatively designated properties" (p. 157). So, for example, since 'pain' and 'c-fiber firing' are informative designators and some competent user cannot know a priori that 'pain' applies to any entity to which 'c-fiber firing' applies, pain does not supervene on c-fiber firing -- a point that Priest later reiterates.

This approach allows Swinburne to analyze the metaphysical modality as a species of analyticity. He thinks that anyone who rejects his anti-physicalist argument must either offer an alternative analysis of metaphysical necessity that breaks the connection to a priority or accept that the metaphysical modality is basic. He finds neither route promising. Unlike Swinburne, I find both non-epistemic reductions of the metaphysical modality and the idea that modal properties are fundamental quite promising. (Incidentally, Kripke seems to agree: he first introduces the possibility of necessary a posteriori truths by asserting (rightly on my view) that our concepts of necessity and a priority are entirely distinct, one being metaphysical and the other being epistemic, which suggests that one cannot correctly analyze one into the other.) Despite this disagreement with Swinburne, I admire the clarity of his essay, especially his identifying his most basic supposition (that the metaphysical and epistemic modalities, in effect, collapse), which, I think, should be a focus of investigation in debates about the mind-body problem.

Göcke argues against physicalism by noting that one can conceive of any given particular existing without oneself existing, which implies that one is not a physical (or non-physical) particular, which is inconsistent with (at least the spirit of) physicalism. He then develops his intriguing "dualism of indistinction". Although both his argument against physicalism and his alternative theory are well developed and interesting, his argument falls short in a way that conceiving-based arguments typically do. Göcke suggests that a proposition is conceivable if it "is consistent with reason alone" (p. 269), but does not explain what sort of reason and consistency he has in mind.

Suppose that reason includes principles of enumerative induction, ontological parsimony, explanatory comprehensiveness, and other principles that we often deploy when reasoning. Suppose also that a proposition is consistent with reason just in case such broadly abductive principles support that proposition more than its negation. Given these suppositions, it is not obvious that we can conceive of self and any given physical particular as separate since abductive principles may support identifying the self with, say, the body. Suppose, instead, that reason excludes such principles. One wonders, then, what reason includes. Is reason direct insight into concepts? Why think we have a faculty for that? Moreover, even if we have a faculty that provides direct insight into our concepts such that our judgments about the modal status of propositions are generally reliable, it would follow that we should exclude parsimony and the like from reason only if modal judgments that result from deploying that faculty were indefeasible. But I see no reason to think they would be indefeasible. The burden for Göcke, then, is to offer either an account of conceptual analysis that makes plain what conceiving is and why it excludes standard principles by which we reason, or an argument that delivers dualist results despite deploying such principles in conceiving.

My comments on the last few essays suggest a point that, I think, applies to the volume more broadly. Contrary to the methods explicitly articulated in this volume, I think that we should assess both the mind-body problem and the problem of personal identity by identifying what we aim to explain (e.g. the correlation between mind and body), identifying a range of plausible theories (e.g. functionalism, Lowe-style substance dualism, Smith-style "physicalism"), and then deploying standard theoretical desiderata (e.g. principles of parsimony, explanatory comprehensiveness, and fruitfulness) to rank the theories qua explanations, provisionally inferring that the top-ranked is true. I do not know whether following this abduction-based epistemology would lead us to dualism or physicalism. I am confident, however, that, contrary to the mood of the volume, choosing would be hard work.