After Physics

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David Z. Albert, After Physics, Harvard University Press, 2015, 181pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780674731264.

Reviewed by David Baker, University of Michigan


David Albert presents us here with a delightful collection of eight essays exploring quantum physics, statistical physics, and metaphysics, and the conceptual connections among them. The essays are not organized around a unified theme. But they are connected by Albert's distinctive philosophical agenda, which I would characterize thus: interpreters of physics must prize intelligibility and conceptual clarity above all. And if this leads us to a picture of reality that is remarkably surprising, which is not at all what we would (prior to interpreting physics) have expected, well then so be it. Reality is strange. Period. Case closed. End of story.

This collection will be a treat for Albert fans. Albert's trademark writing style is lively, conversational, and fun, and (as befits his subject) evocative of a certain sense of wonder, and if not inimitable (exactly), then at least unique to him. And it is very much on display in After Physics. Despite its structure as an essay collection, the book is comprehensive, including commentary on nearly all the major topics of Albert's previous work. Taken together, these essays represent another step forward in that body of work; indeed, some of them are already landmark papers.

The opening essay, "Physics and Chance," defends two bold theses: first, that chance (objective physical probability) is indispensable even in deterministic physical theories; second, that everything about our world is reducible to fundamental physics. In a deterministic theory, chance must take the form of an objective probability distribution over possible histories of the universe; as in his (2003) Time and Chance, Albert argues that such a distribution is necessary to explain the success of statistical mechanics.

In Albert's view, this picture demands a Humean understanding of physical modal facts about law and chance, on which these "modal" facts summarize the fundamental physical facts rather than governing them. After all, the chance of some deterministic history obtaining cannot fit into an anti-Humean picture of chance as the propensity of initial states to produce different later states.

Here I think Albert goes too far, ignoring another possibility. It could be that the chance distribution over histories is best understood as a Humean, non-governing modal fact, but that the deterministic laws of classical physics are full-blooded, non-Humean governing laws. Humean laws are, after all, just a sort of summary of the facts. There is no reason they could not coexist with other, more robust governing laws. Indeed, a picture like this could explain why it's tempting to think that the probability distribution over histories isn't physically necessary in the same sense as the deterministic laws.

Albert's defense of reductionism, on the other hand, is masterful. He points out that many explanations internal to physics share the features of special-science explanations (such as multiple realizability) which seem to suggest that the special sciences cannot be reduced to physics. Since physical explanations are obviously reducible to physics, it must be that multiple realizability is not incompatible with reduction after all. Non-specialists as well as philosophers of science will find this first chapter both readable and edifying.

"The Difference between the Past and the Future" is written in the form of a dialogue between "Huckleberry" (a stand-in for Albert) and "Jedediah," a critic who shares some views in common with Tim Maudlin. Jedediah raises a variety of objections to Huckleberry's position that our perception of time's arrow is explained by the postulate (called the past hypothesis) that one of time's endpoints (the one we call "the past") is much lower in entropy than the other endpoint.

Huckleberry does a fine job responding to a variety of pressing objections. The resulting view is highly counterintuitive: our inability to influence the past turns out to be only an approximate, for-all-practical-purposes inability rather than a true impossibility. Opponents who cannot accept this may see the essay as an exercise in bullet-biting, but more flexible readers will find that it all hangs together well, despite a fair bit of sketchiness in the account's details.

"The Past Hypothesis and Knowledge of the External World" begins with an argument that we can learn from experience and experiment only if we assume that our measuring devices (our senses included) began in a "ready state," and that this assumption amounts to affirming the past hypothesis. We are then treated to a criticism of the claims of physicists investigating Bohm's interpretation of quantum mechanics, who have tried to prove that Bohmian mechanics entails the same limitations on an observer's knowledge as ordinary quantum mechanics. This is not my favorite essay in the volume; it jumps around quite a bit and will be mostly of in-house interest to Bohmians.

"The Technique of Significables," on the other hand, provides a shining example of the straightforward, common-sense insight that characterizes Albert's best work. Tackling the problem of which quantities in quantum theory should count as detectable, Albert points out that we can answer this question by simply picking a device for record-keeping which we know to be under our control (his example is the position of golf balls) and determining whether the quantities in question can be made to influence that record-keeping device. It's the sort of insight that makes you wonder why you haven't been seeing the problem Albert's way all along. He then applies this technique to establish the impossibility of faster-than-light signaling in collapse and hidden-variable interpretations of quantum mechanics. This essay is short and sweet -- a real gem.

In its previous life as an unpublished manuscript, "Physics and Narrative" has already attained the status of a classic. Albert presents a quantum mechanical example in which the state at every instant of time in one (special relativistic) frame of reference does not uniquely determine the sequence of instantaneous states with respect to a different frame. To find the relationship between the sequence of states in one frame and the sequence of states in the other, one also needs to know the dynamical laws of time-evolution that govern the system (i.e., the system's Hamiltonian). Albert names this phenomenon the failure of narratability.

Albert tentatively suggests that we respond to this example by giving up the Einsteinian picture of relativity in favor of the Lorentzian view that an undetectable preferred frame exists. Less radical alternatives are possible, though -- for example, one might deny the existence of truly instantaneous states. Moreover, Judes (2010) has shown that Albert's example violates the cluster decomposition principle, which is a common feature of our most fundamental existing quantum theories. Unless a more realistic example of narratability failure can be found, we may not need to adapt our understanding of quantum theory to accommodate it.

"Quantum Mechanics and Everyday Life" briefly argues for and then expounds on one of Albert's most well-known and widely discussed positions: wavefunction realism. On this view, the quantum world fundamentally consists of a complex-valued field that exists in an extremely high-dimensional space. Albert's description of how an ontology like this might recover the familiar manifest appearance of three-dimensional reality is of great foundational interest. Making sense of how we might be mistaken about the number of spatial dimensions in our world is an extremely difficult problem, which also arises in other fields of physics, like string theory. Albert makes significant progress on this problem.

Wavefunction realism, however, itself is of less intrinsic interest than Albert suggests here. The view is extremely implausible for a variety of reasons. As Albert notes, it requires throwing out the usual picture of relativistic spacetime. It also requires ascribing fundamental reality to the undetectable global phase of the quantum state, one of the clearest examples of surplus mathematical structure in all of physics. Albert makes things look easy for wavefuction realism by presenting only a single alternative that shares these disadvantages (the dualistic view that the wavefunction in high-dimensional space exists in parallel with familiar three-dimensional reality). But there are many alternative ontologies that avoid some or all of these disadvantages (Belot 2012, Miller 2014, Wallace and Timpson 2010). Since Albert ignores these alternatives, this essay succeeds as an exploration of wavefunction realism but not as a defense of it.

"Primitive Ontology" criticizes a family of interpretations of quantum mechanics, including Bohmian mechanics and the so-called flash and mass-density versions of GRW collapse theory, which posit three-dimensional configurations of matter in addition to the quantum state. These theories are often prized for their easy conceptual intelligibility. We think of matter as the sort of thing that fills three-dimensional space -- the sort of thing we can picture geometrically. On primitive ontology theories, this folk conception turns out to be true.

But as Albert points out, there is another folk commitment that primitive ontology theories abandon. We ordinarily think that matter affects other matter through interactions like collisions, gravitational attraction, etc. On primitive ontology theories, though, these apparent interactions are really the result of the quantum state pushing the matter around. The matter, on the other hand, does not affect the quantum state, so it isn't as if we can understand this as the state mediating cause-and-effect interactions between the matter. The matter is just a pile of inert stuff that is acted upon but doesn't act upon anything else. Albert's point is that while primitive ontology theories save our pre-theoretic conception of matter filling up three-dimensional space, they accomplish this by throwing away our pre-theoretic conception of matter as stuff that interacts.

It's not entirely clear what epistemological assumptions are being made here, but what seems to be happening is that both primitive ontology theorists and Albert are trying to satisfy an imperative for methodological conservatism. The question, then, is which part of our manifest conception of the world is more indispensable: the notion that matter fills up three-dimensional space, or the notion that matter interacts. Both seem pretty crucial! It's enough to make one hope that some alternative interpretation -- the many-worlds interpretation, for example -- might let us have it all.

No such luck, Albert argues. The final chapter, "Probability in the Everett Picture," attacks the trendy decision-theoretic account of probability in the many-worlds interpretation. Prima facie, it is a great puzzle why we should observe the ordinary probabilities predicted by quantum mechanics on the many-worlds view, which entails that every possible outcome of every experiment actually occurs in some branch of the universal wavefunction. (No, there aren't more branches for the more probable outcomes.) The going answer to this puzzle is that when a supposedly well-motivated principle called equivalence is adopted, together with some axioms of decision theory, it would be irrational to bet on the outcome of an experiment except in a way that accords with the ordinary quantum probabilities.

Betting, as Albert observes, is hardly the whole of probability's role in our lives, and as he rightly points out there is a variety of problems for the many-worlds view stemming from this fact. He follows this up with an entertaining and pointed attack on the equivalence principle assumed by the many-worlds view. It is not contrary to reason, Albert points out, to weight the probabilities of branches by some physical quantity within those branches (the example he gives is the observer's mass). But to do so would violate equivalence; consequently, equivalence is not an acceptable principle of rationality. This chapter poses a difficult challenge that every many-worlds theorist must grapple with.

This is a fine collection, although not without its flaws. Earlier I praised Albert's unique style. But not every stylistic quirk of After Physics is praiseworthy; one in particular would have been easy to improve upon. In many of the essays, citations are sparse and unsystematic. Sometimes full bibliographic data is given in a footnote, but at other times only an author's name and title appear in the main text. The work of Gibbs and Boltzmann in statistical mechanics, and Sheldon Goldstein and Maudlin's arguments against primitive observability, are discussed without mentioning even a title. Direct quotations from the references are sometimes provided without page numbers. Readers hoping to follow up on Albert's discussion of other works will have to consult Google rather more extensively than they might like.

While I would've appreciated another round of editing to correct these omissions, it is a testament to Albert -- to the wit, sharp intellect and sense of fun that he brings to his project -- that I accepted them happily in exchange for the rewards offered by After Physics. In an age of pioneering new philosophy that now addresses cutting-edge topics like string theory, gauge theories and quantum field theory, it's important to get back to basics once in a while -- to remind oneself that even well-worn physical theories like statistical physics and quantum mechanics remain deeply mysterious. No one is better at exploring these most basic mysteries of physics than Albert.


Albert, D. (1992). Quantum Mechanics and Experience. Harvard University Press.

Albert, D. (2003). Time and Chance. Harvard University Press.

Belot, G. (2012). Quantum states for primitive ontologists. European Journal for Philosophy of Science 2: 67-83.

Judes, S. (2010). Narratability and Cluster Decomposition.

Miller, E. (2014). Quantum Entanglement, Bohmian Mechanics, and Humean Supervenience. Australasian Journal of Philosophy 92: 567-683.

Wallace, D. and C.G. Timpson. (2010). Quantum Mechanics on Spacetime I: Spacetime State Realism. British Journal for the Philosophy of Science 61: 697-727.