After Rorty: The Possibilities for Ethics and Religious Belief

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G. Elijah Dann, After Rorty: The Possibilities for Ethics and Religious Belief, Continuum International Publishing Group, 2006, 209pp., $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 0826489028.

Reviewed by Elizabeth Sperry, William Jewell College


In this book, G. Elijah Dann explores the implications of Richard Rorty's neo-pragmatism for religion and morality.  Given the broad landscape surveyed, readers would have benefited from the guidance of a thesis or a central organizing argument; they are not supplied with one.  Dann attempts an exposition of Rorty's published views on religion; an explanation of the deeper import of Rorty's views for religion; criticism of Tapio Puolimatka's argument that only moral realism will enable teaching of democratic values to children; criticism of Stephen Carter, Jeffrey Stout, and Nicholas Wolterstorff for their claims that religious belief deserves a larger role in public discourse; criticism of Alvin Plantinga for deriding Rorty's approach to truth as incoherent in general and unable to trounce religious belief in particular; criticism of Kai Nielsen for finding religious concepts nonsensical; suggestions for new directions in theology; and a presentation of the connection between Rorty's thinking and the theology of Gianni Vattimo.  Although there is a very loose coherence here, there is no central conceptual bond, particularly since Dann focuses heavily on interlocutors of Rorty.  Why are Rorty's views on ethics considered?  "Because religious belief also involves moral matters" (43) and "the subject of ethics and meta-ethics is a natural extension of these [religious] topics" (3).  "Involves"?  A "natural extension"?  How?  Dann says nothing further, and the reader is left vainly hoping for an integrating analysis.

Despite its scattershot approach, this book considers important issues.  Once essentialism goes, what becomes of religion?  As Dann rightly notes, "Putting aside interest in metaphysics, epistemological foundations and essentialist views of Truth, at most disqualifies some, though not all forms of religious belief" (53).  Post-essentialist religion will focus on Deweyan "problems of society" and successful habits of action.  All social projects, whether religiously motivated or not, are to be separated from personal pursuits, a Rortyian bifurcation much criticized elsewhere.  The private-public distinction is of great value for Rorty's and Dann's purposes, however, since it enables a distinction between personally-valued faith on the one hand, and democratically-reasoned projects on the other.  Any public project, regardless of its private significance to individuals, is subject to the requirement that it be discussable on the basis of non-idiosyncratic foundations: public conversations cannot proceed properly if some participants rely on presuppositions which other participants cannot accept, such as the authority of the Bible.  Hence Rorty provides the basis for a rebuff of ecclesiastical institutions that impose their theocratic projects on a democratic public, and does so without necessitating a rejection of personal religious faith (interestingly, Rorty has stopped calling himself an atheist and has now adopted the label "anti-clerical"). 

In some cases, pragmatism may actually revivify private faith, since the opposed, essentialistic approach to truth can make religious belief seem epistemically irresponsible.  Now believers vexed by their inability to "mirror" religious experience have a philosophical alternative.  Beliefs need no longer be defended with claims to know the innate structure of reality.  Instead, beliefs become more "true" the more they enhance human life.  Despite Dann's failure to treat these ideas in a carefully structured fashion, the ideas themselves remain important and worth considering. 

Dann does make some legitimate, specific contributions.  He is correct that Kai Nielsen's anti-essentialism conflicts with his demand that religious belief satisfy a correspondence theory of truth; as long as belief is not based on metaphysical realism, Nielsen's attacks on religion cannot succeed.  Dann is accurate as well when he explains that Alvin Plantinga criticizes Rortyian truth without understanding it.  Plantinga sees Rorty as claiming that religious believers create God's existence, and that unbelievers render God non-existent; this results from Plantinga's confused insistence that Rorty's understanding of truth as sentential means that human language use creates reality.  This befuddles Rorty's critically important notion that the world is at it is, but requires language and concepts from speakers to characterize that pre-existing world.  Dann is also helpful when he notes that Plantinga's approach to belief relies on an overly rationalistic assessment of epistemic motivation, and that Rorty provides a useful alternate account: we may be appropriately motivated to change our beliefs thanks to our experiences, rather than solely due to discursive Plantingian "defeaters."  Dann is intriguing when he pushes for edifying theology over systematic theology (assimilable to Rorty's edifying rather than systematic philosophy), although what this edifying theology would incorporate or produce is left maddeningly vague.  One compelling exception to that vagueness lies in Dann's brief report on Gianni Vattimo's analysis of kenosis, God's self-emptying and repudiation of transcendence in order to effect the incarnation. 

In other areas, the reader wishes for greater accuracy and deeper analysis.  First, in a book putatively focused on the general category of religious belief, it is odd to find the writer discussing nothing but the prospects for specifically Christian religious belief.  Dann's discussion of systematic versus edifying theology makes clear that it is Christianity he has primarily in mind; and yet this is neither what the title has led us to expect, nor an accurate representation of the larger possibilities for religious belief that Rortyanism enables us to consider. 

Second, it is surprising to read that "Plantinga is closer to Rorty than he realizes"  thanks to their shared contention that "there is no final or ultimate way of seeing if our beliefs fit with reality" (126).  Certainly both acknowledge that the human situation features dubiety; but Rorty's anti-representationalism arrives at uncertainty from a very different direction than Plantinga's traditionalist representationalism-with-no-potential-for-apodictic-fulfillment.  In this case, the path one travels to doubt is of signal importance.  Given the distance between systematizing epistemology and an edifying refusal to engage in epistemology, Plantinga and Rorty remain just as far from one another as they originally thought they were. 

Third, it is vexing to be given no suggestions concerning how, in the absence of essentialism and representationalism, to conceive of God.  Is God a successful habit of action?  Exactly what is it in which believers believe?  What can religious belief be, or be about, without setting off the pragmatist's or postmodernist's warning system?   As Dann himself notes, belief must be "about" something, and believers must have sufficient access to what it is in which they believe for them to be able to answer questions about their faith.  We want to be able to explain ourselves to ourselves, and to others. 

Dann is right, then, when he maintains that it is unfair of Rorty to allow religious believers only "faith" rather than "belief."  Given that a religious person could usually give at least some minimal reasons for her beliefs, "belief" does seem to be the appropriate term.  Otherwise, faith would be entirely empty, which does not conform to believers' experiences.

But Dann misses another philosophical opportunity, for there are important epistemological questions here.  Where justification is primarily social, what is the epistemic role of private religious belief?  Our beliefs must cohere with our larger culture; what does that mean for religious belief?  What does it, in fact, mean for all privately-held beliefs?  Our beliefs make use of language and concepts which are themselves cultural products; on the other hand, many of us hold beliefs that are at least somewhat opposed to those predominant in our culture. Are such beliefs potentially licit if linked to "successful habits of action"?  But then whose determination of "successful" carries weight?  And if we dismiss religious belief too easily on these grounds, how will other privately held beliefs fare?  Perhaps these questions evaporate when we insist that religious belief, like other private Rorty-supported beliefs, must be held ironically.  Yet it is unclear how religious belief can be sustained with a fully ironic attitude.  After Rorty, it seems more important than ever to address these complications.

After Rorty addresses a thought-provoking series of topics.  It does not link those topics together with a clearly articulated philosophical vision, nor, by and large, does it investigate those topics in an analytically rich and careful fashion.  Readers may find the book helpful for a quick overview of Rorty's thinking on religious matters, and for occasional flashes of insight about the details.  But this is not a definitive treatment.  Finally, even casual readers are likely to be put off by the high frequency with which spelling, grammatical and stylistic errors arise.  One wishes an editor at Continuum had exercised a heavier hand in the shaping and execution of this work.