After Whitehead: Rescher on Process Metaphysics

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Michel Weber (ed.), After Whitehead: Rescher on Process Metaphysics, Ontos, 2004, 339pp. ' 89.00 (hbk), ISBN 3937202498.

Reviewed by Joseph A. Bracken, Xavier University


In 1996 Nicholas Rescher, University Professor of Philosophy at the University of Pittsburgh, published a slim volume entitled Process Metaphysics: An Introduction to Process Philosophy (Albany, NY: SUNY). Therein he defended the superiority of contemporary processual modes of thought to the more traditional substance-oriented approaches to reality in the history of Western philosophy. While principally engaged with the presuppositions of the process-relational metaphysics of Alfred North Whitehead and his disciples, Rescher made clear from the beginning what he considered to be the antecedents of process Metaphysics in Heraclitus, Plato, Aristotle, Leibniz, Hegel, Bergson, the American pragmatists (Peirce, James, Dewey); likewise, he pointed out what in his view are crucial mistakes in Whitehead’s scheme which have yet to be corrected by current proponents of process philosophy and theology. Michel Weber, currently at the University of Louvain in Belgium, and his colleagues from Europe and North America use the present volume to evaluate and critique the work of Rescher in that same book. They do so, moreover, in very precise fashion since each contributor focuses solely on the issues raised in a single chapter of Process Metaphysics. In addition, there is a Preface written by Paul Gochet (Belgium) which provides an historical context for the basic issues involved in each chapter, and an Introduction written by Weber which highlights differences between Rescher and Whitehead, above all, on the key issue whether process is continuous or discontinuous, i.e., flowing without interruption or composed of discrete units rapidly succeeding one another. Finally, Rescher himself is given space at the end to respond to his critics. The result is a sometimes rather dense but generally quite insightful discussion of both the achievements and the still unresolved questions of the process-oriented approach to reality.

In what follows, I will first take note of what Rescher claims in the various chapters of his book and indicate what the critic in After Whitehead says about the chapter. Afterwards, I will summarize Rescher’s response to his critics and add my own brief evaluation of the claims made on both sides. In Chapter One, Rescher surveys the history of Western philosophy and concludes that process thinking in some form or other has been in circulation from the beginning but that it has flourished in North America through being linked with the philosophy of pragmatism. His critic, Michael Hempe (Switzerland), objects to the notion of process philosophy as a more or less univocal term and sees instead a broad linkage with empiricism and the growth of the natural sciences. Lieven Decock (Netherlands) likewise thinks that Rescher’s focus on the distinction between substance and process-oriented philosophies in Chapter Two is mistaken and suggests instead that the true sparring partner to process thought is mathematics since mathematical formulas have classically been conceived as time invariant or resistant to processual modes of thought. In Chapter Three of his book, Rescher argues, pace P. F. Strawson, that particulars or individual things should be understood as unified sets of processes rather than as substances that act in specified ways. His critic, Johanna Seibt (Denmark), thinks that Rescher is still too classically oriented to “things” since many processes are in fact “subjectless” with only a recurrent pattern of activity over space and time (like the continuous flowing of a river). In Chapter Four Rescher takes up the notion of universals and argues persuasively that nature itself is in constant transformation and regularly produces not only new things but new kinds of things, new universals. His critic, George Schields (USA), agrees but wonders how this compares with Whitehead’s notion of “eternal objects” and the “primordial nature” of God. In Chapter Five of his book, Rescher proposes that process thought accords better with the notion of ongoing evolution in Nature as proposed by contemporary natural science, but his critic Pete Gunter (USA) points out that, while Rescher evidently favors the idea of an intrinsic movement in Nature toward more complex and sophisticated forms of natural existence, most natural scientists are wary of postulating any inherent directionality to evolution. Along the same lines in Chapter Six, Rescher declares that human personhood is best understood as a unified manifold of processes which over time spell out a fully intelligible personal history. His critics, Harald Atmanspracher (Germany) and Jack Martin (Canada), agree but contend that more emphasis should be placed on the interpersonal and environmental dimensions of human personhood as well as on the linkage between mind and body.

Tackling epistemological issues in Chapters Seven and Eight, Rescher argues in Chapter Seven that knowledge and truth are not timeless but everchanging realities because the “cognitive opacity” of things prevents us from knowing everything about them. It is thus a mistake to think that knowledge is the acquisition of facts since what is meant by a fact undergoes alteration with the acquisition of new information about it. Pursuing that line of thought more deeply in Chapter Eight, Rescher notes how science and technology are inextricably bound together. Advanced technology uncovers new experimental data which have to be incorporated into more advanced theories within the scientific field in question. Thus science by definition will always be partial and incomplete. His critics in both chapters basically concur. Jacques Riche (Belgium) notes that contemporary scientific method depends upon two principles, uniformity and communicability, both of which presuppose an intersubjective world of discourse in which differing conceptual models of empirical reality are proposed and evaluated. Hanne Andersen (Denmark) agrees but also believes that Rescher’s distinction between substance and process-oriented ontologies is blurred when empirical researchers cannot agree whether they are discovering or constructing the underlying structure of the world. In Chapter Nine, Rescher sets forth the advantages of process-oriented thought for theology, in particular, the God-world relationship. Noting the difficulties which classical metaphysicians had in conceiving God as both like and unlike other beings, Rescher applauds the way in which God from a process perspective participates in the world without being physically part of it. Moreover, functioning in the world as transcendent Final Cause rather than as First Efficient Cause, God can give intrinsic meaning and value to a cosmic process apparently without purpose or direction. John Cobb (USA), perhaps the best known disciple of Whitehead at present, appreciates Rescher’s close linkage of process philosophy and process theology but believes that his understanding of the God-world relationship in process terms lacks the specificity needed to propose a viable alternative to classical metaphysics and theology. One must make clear how God acts in the world through influence rather than coercion and how creatures can likewise influence God’s behavior toward the world. Finally, Cobb takes issue with Rescher’s belief that process is continuous rather than discontinuous and thus broken up into discrete moments of experience (actual occasions). For, as Whitehead realized, there seems to be no other way to account for the emergence of genuine novelty within the cosmic process.

Bringing his exposition to a close in Chapter Ten and the Appendix, Rescher argues that a process philosophy is necessarily a philosophy which is itself in process; hence, it is not a fixed set of categories but more like an ongoing research program in which one would expect periodic changes in perspective and methodology among its practitioners. Furthermore, better than substance-oriented philosophies, it explains shifts over the millenia in the style of philosophizing. Then in a short appendix he sketches a possible process semantics in which the focus would be no longer on nouns and adjectives but on verbs and adverbs. Anderson Weekes (USA) in his critique of Chapter Ten notes an ambiguity in Rescher’s endorsement of process thought. By reason of his prior commitment to North American pragmatism, he seems to favor conceptual processism over ontological processism, i.e., process in human understanding of reality rather than process within reality apart from human interaction. Yet Rescher must then deal with the paradox that the key category of process becomes “transcendental,” not empirical, since it is not subject to falsification. Ontologically oriented process thinkers like Bergson and Whitehead, on the contrary, can maintain that the notion of process is in principle falsifiable since it is only an empirical inference, not an a priori truth. Robert Poli (Italy) offers a critique of Rescher’s process semantics, arguing that the shift in logic from a focus on nouns and adjectives to a focus on verbs and adverbs is not enough. Only synthetic differential geometry seems capable of analyzing motion in terms of a succession of points which are endowed with potentiality as well as here and now actuality.

Rescher’s response to his critics in the final section of the book is understandably limited in view of their numbers and the range of their arguments. With respect to Hampe, for example, Rescher concedes that his historical survey of process-oriented thinkers was incomplete but argues that he was only trying to give the outline of a processive approach to reality through reference to representative thinkers. In response to Decock, Rescher sees no inconsistency in using unchanging mathematical formulas to describe ever changing physical reality. But here, pace Rescher, I would argue that Decock (along with Poli in his critique of the Appendix as noted above) may be correct in urging the necessity for a new foundation to mathematics in which time is a factor, that is, where mathematical “points” are thought to possess potentiality for change as well as fixed actuality, somewhat akin to Whiteheadian actual occasions. In response to Seibt, Rescher concedes his difficulty in following her argument that processes must be both type and token, both generic and particular, at the same time. As I see it, Seibt may have meant that processes are by definition specifically social realities, i.e, sets of individual events/ entities with an ongoing pattern of interrelation. Yet in some cases these socially constituted realities also function as particulars or individual agents (e.g., a human being presiding over his/her bodily functions). If so, then one could have recourse to the Whiteheadian notion of a “structured society” in which a regnant subsociety of actual occasions exists to give order and direction to the other subsocieties of actual occasions within the structured society. With reference to the notion of eternal objects in Whitehead’s philosophy, Rescher agrees with Shields that instead of appealing to the primordial nature of God as the source of an infinite range of possibilities, it is more sensible to distinguish between logical and real possibilities within the finite conditions of this world.

In his response to Gunter, on the one hand, and to Atmanspracher and Martin, on the other hand, Rescher is a bit more feisty, arguing that in both cases his critics misinterpreted him. With reference to Gunter, for example, he defends a position midway between naive realism and scepticism about our human knowledge of the world of nature; through science we keep learning more about the inner workings of nature, but science will never give us definitive answers about how things really exist and are related to one another. Likewise, he rejects Atmanspracher’s and Martin’s claim that he subordinates the socio-cultural dimensions of personhood to the biological, reminding them that he clearly distinguishes between causal explanations in which top-down and bottom-up processes are at issue and hermeneutics which ranges back and forth horizontally within the history of ideas. Likewise, he questions their insistence on transiency as the key to the emergence of novelty since the new does not always supplant but sometimes only supplements the old. Here the deeper issue, however, might be that of continuity versus discontinuity in the understanding of process, something to which I shall return below. Commenting on the work of Riche and Andersen, Rescher praises Riche for his insights into contemporary scientific method in which specialized methods of inquiry more than distinct areas of investigation distinguish the sciences from one another. Likewise, he is grateful to Andersen for her general approbation of his process-oriented approach to science but is sceptical of her claim that a “developmental” approach to species differentiation in Nature undercuts the differences between substance and process-oriented ontologies. Is she in turn not blurring the difference between ontology and epistemology, the way things are versus the way we have come to understand them?

Commenting on John Cobb’s essay, Rescher returns to the key issue already raised by Weber in the Introduction and then re-emphasized by Cobb: namely, whether the possibility for genuine novelty in the cosmic process requires discontinuity or atomicity in the ultimate units of reality (for Whitehead actual occasions). Rescher favors process “all the way down,” although he concedes that at any given level of complexity one may treat the basic components as elementary and thus as indecomposable for the purposes of empirical investigation. I myself would side with Cobb and Weber on this issue but also argue that there are problems associated with the atomicity of Whitehead’s understanding of reality which can only be resolved by further attention to his notion of “society.” If actual occasions are necessarily discontinuous so as to allow for the emergence of novelty in the cosmic process, would not societies then as a different kind of processual reality than actual occasions necessarily be continuous in their rate of change? Somehow both continuity and discontinuity must be preserved within our understanding of process (both mental and extra-mental). In his response to Weekes, Rescher first admits his indebtedness to North American pragmatism but then claims that for the same reason it is impossible to distinguish sharply between ontological and epistemological approaches to reality: “We simply cannot get at the ontology of things save by means of the conceptual thought machinery at our disposal for its characterization” (p. 317). Here, too, I would agree with Weber and Cobb that Rescher achieves a praise-worthy level of generality in dealing with process-oriented issue only at the price of a certain vagueness with respect to the details of his metaphysical vision. One could, for example, support Rescher’s thesis about the “cognitive opacity” of things not simply on pragmatic grounds (given the drive for further intelligibility on every conceivable front), but likewise on specifically metaphysical grounds, namely, in the claim that subjects of experience (actual occasions) can never be fully objectified without as a result ceasing to be subjects of experience. In the final analysis, then, subjectivity at different levels of existence and activity in this world accounts for the cognitive opacity of things as known from empirical investigation.

To sum up, then, I judge this book to be a notable achievement both in terms of its overall organization and in the level of sustained reflection on various key issues within an overall process-oriented approach to reality. It is, moreover, quite encouraging for a North American student of Whitehead’s philosophy like myself, to see European scholars show serious interest in process-relational metaphysics. Finally, this book aptly reminds us not to subject Whitehead’s thought to a rigid scholasticism in which all questions are routinely resolved through appeal to a given set of texts. In this respect, Rescher is certainly correct in claiming that process philosophy is a philosophy in process.