Against Absolute Goodness

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Richard Kraut, Against Absolute Goodness, Oxford University Press, 2011, 240pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199844463.

Reviewed by Nomy Arpaly, Brown University


The obligatory joke -- this book is very good, but not absolutely so -- has essentially been made already in a blurb on the cover. In the blurb, Russ Shafer Landau says the book is excellent, and I have to agree it is. It is also very well written. With its lucid prose -- rare in a philosophy book -- it can be read in one sitting.

Kraut defends the view that there is neither absolute goodness nor absolute badness. By this he does not mean that Hitler is not an absolutely morally hideous person, nor does he mean that, as one's undergraduate students are fond of saying, it's all subjective. Kraut means that nothing should be called "good, period" or "simply good". A thing can only be good for someone or good of a kind. Thus a thing can be objectively and noninstrumentally good or bad for a person or any other creature to whose well being it makes sense to refer. Different things can be objectively, noninstrumentally good for different creatures -- I am reminded of Spinoza declaring that music is good to the melancholy, bad to those who mourn, and neither good nor bad to the deaf -- but some things might be bad for a lot of creatures -- some kinds of pain are perhaps bad for all sentient beings. A thing can also be a good of a kind. For example, a thing can be a good toaster or a good tennis player. The good tennis player is not a person who possesses two qualities -- the property of being good and the property of being a tennis player (though Moore might want us to believe he does). She is a person who is good qua tennis player. Unlike other thinkers he cites, like Geach and Thomson, Kraut does not think that saying that something is "good, period" or "just plain good" is an abuse of language. He just claims that, like phlogiston, absolute goodness simply is not there, and that, just like in the case of phlogiston, it can be shown by pointing to all the work the concept of absolute goodness cannot do as well as the work it does not need to do because other concepts do it better.

Kraut agrees with Scanlon that it might be fine to say that an action or a state of affairs is good and mean that there are reasons to do the action or to bring about the state of affairs but takes this not to be a problem. If eating ice cream is something I have reasons to do, such as the pleasure it might bring, then there is no property called goodness which figures in my practical reasoning: I don't eat the ice cream because there is something called "goodness" that it has in abundance but rather I do it for the reasons I have to do it, such as the pleasure it might bring. Kraut disagrees with Scanlon in holding that "good for someone" (which he later identifies with "contributes to someone's flourishing") does not pass the buck in the same manner, and neither does "a good x" when it means "good of a kind". Thus I can eat a cup of ice cream for the reason that it is good for me (I appreciate Scanlon and Kraut not falling in with the pro-dieting trend in moral psychology examples) or advise you to go on a holiday because it would be good for you. I can also watch a play because it is a good play -- but that gets trickier. Wouldn't it be enough to say that I watch the play because it has multi-dimensional characters, credible dialogue, and other such properties? If I cite such properties as reasons for you to see the play I don't need to add "and it's also a good play". In fact, it would be strange to add it.

Why, then, is goodness of a kind more viable than absolute goodness? Kraut says that categories such as "a good play" are very useful in our reasoning. If I want to give you reasons to see the play "this is a good play" is such a reason, a good alternative to the list of non-evaluative properties that I can cite. On the other hand "going on a holiday is good, period" is useless when I give you reasons to go on a holiday. It seems quite intuitive to me, but since Kraut tells us that saying "and the play is good" does not add a reason when you add it to the list of good-making features (no more than "a holiday would be good" adds a reason to go on the holiday) I am not sure he manages to explain why "it's a good play" is more useful than "it's good, period". Remember, he cannot resort to the view that saying "it's good, period" makes no sense, as he argues against this view. Perhaps a beginning of an answer might have to do with the fact that "it's a good play" covers only one type of reasons to watch a play, as I might have reasons to watch that are not aesthetic. "It's a good play" would still be a shorthand, but "you have reasons to watch it because it's a good play" would be more useful than "you have reasons to watch it because you have reasons to watch it", which is Kraut's idea of "because it is good, period".

In thirty short chapters (and 5 appendices, which should have been printed in normal-sized letters rather than in Infinite Jest-style tiny print) Kraut looks systematically at things that are often taken to be good "period": innocent pleasure, knowledge, beauty, friendship, virtue, persons, and other usual suspects. When discussing pleasure and pain, he says, there is no need to refer to the absolute goodness of some types of pleasure or the absolute badness of some types of pain. Some pleasures are good for those who have them and some pains are bad for those who have them. This is a perfectly good reason to pursue the former and shun the latter. What does one add by saying that they are also "good" and "bad" respectively? Kraut argues that nothing is added that way, which he calls "the problem of double value".

When discussing knowledge, Kraut finds an opportunity to present his "ethical objection" to absolute goodness. He gives an example of a person who is devoted to mathematical knowledge despite believing that it is not good for anyone: she just thinks it's good, period. This person teaches her talented son mathematics without considering whether or not it is good for him or for other people he might encounter. She just thinks he should know mathematics because mathematical knowledge is good, period. Kraut thinks this is a chilly person. Her relationship with her son is "depersonalized" by her belief in absolute goodness. For those who think that children are special cases, Kraut offers the case of a doctor who is on a crusade to eradicate pain but who does not care whether or not pain is bad for his patients. He, too, will be "chilly". I have my doubts about Kraut's examples. Being a parent or a doctor is a context in which one is expected to be particularly devoted to the good of certain humans. When the mathematical mother is considered as someone who proves theorems rather than as a mother it's not as clear that she is, in this context, chilly simply because she believes in the absolute goodness of this activity and is motivated by that belief. But the topic of ethical objections to absolute goodness surfaces again later in the book in a very interesting way. Doctors and judges who are against euthanasia, says Kraut, seek to protect human life as a good thing without asking themselves whom it is good for. If the answer is "nobody" and if Kraut is right in general about the non-existence of absolute goodness, than a metaethical discussion might have implications in applied ethics.

Kraut discusses beauty, engaging with Moore. Our enjoyment of beauty is good, he agrees, but it is good for us. When we go out to enjoy a day at a museum we don't set out to increase the number of good things in the world but to enrich our lives. Surprisingly, Kraut tries to accommodate rather than reject Moore's intuition that a beautiful world is better than an ugly world even if there is no one around to behold either world. He says that we can say that one world is better than another without implying that there is a property called goodness that one world has more than the other one does. "This world is better" is not equivalent to "this grass is greener" -- where there is a property of greenness and this grass has it more than that grass -- but rather to "this box is larger" -- there is no property of largeness which one box has more than the other. I find the size analogy confusing. Can there be better that is not better for someone or better of a kind? If so, does Kraut's view not seem considerably less provocative than it seems at first? The thesis that goodness is graded on a curve, like size, while it conflicts with Moore's view of the good, is not very radical. I think it would be best for Kraut to dispense with boxes altogether. There is a better way for him to handle absolute betterness, as he suggests that a state of affairs can be "better" than another state of affairs in the buck-passing sense that we have overwhelming reasons to bring about one rather than the other.

Another supposed absolutely good thing discussed by Kraut is good will -- Kant's idea of the absolutely good thing. Even without being a Kantian, one can well believe that some things like motivations, intentions, and virtues are good or evil even if they do not in fact help or harm anyone -- say, because blind luck intervenes. The moral worth of an action might not depend on its actual consequences -- even if its rightness or wrongness has to do with the type of consequences it usually brings about. Is cruelty absolutely bad? Kraut asks this question and answers that no, it is not. The badness of cruelty is derivative from the fact that the cruel person is oriented in a certain way towards doing things to people that are bad for them. She intends or desires to harm others, and that is what we mean when we say that she is bad. Kraut points out that if a large number of people react sympathetically and virtuously to bad things happening to others we call that "good, period", but we do not reason as if with a large enough number of sympathetic responses it is worthwhile for the bad things to have happened.

Kraut relies here on a strange fact about moral worth: the fact that we should not aim to increase the amount of moral worth in the world. To do so would be like wanting there to be more war so as to increase the number of instances of heroism. But does that mean that we want to deny that heroism (in the service of the right cause) is good? Kraut would say that the goodness of the hero comes from his intention to bring about things that are good for people. Why, however, or for whom, is it good that people get what is good for them or that people intend to give people what is good for them? If "good for a person" means "contributes to her flourishing" then in what sense is it good that persons flourish, while it hardly matters if crabgrass flourishes? Kraut could reply that intending to do things that are good for people makes you good in your kind -- a good person (earlier in the book he comments that Hitler was an absolutely bad person but that the word "person" is essential here). He could argue that "it's good that persons flourish" translates into "there are reasons to bring about a situation in which persons flourish". I am not sure that would be enough. Perhaps a concept of "morally good" could be helpful somewhere?

Indeed, another thing that is supposed to be good (or "valuable") independently of goodness for anyone or goodness of a kind would be persons. Persons are more valuable than other creatures, it is said, perhaps because of their autonomy. Otherwise, why do we treat them differently from other animals? It is also true that sentient beings are more valuable than nonsentient beings. Otherwise, one might ask, why do we treat them differently from other things? Kraut argues that killing persons is worse than killing mice because persons have more to lose when they die prematurely. Death is a bigger harm to a person than it is to a mouse because a person's life is richer and potentially much better in many ways than a mouse's life, so death is bad for the person more than it is bad for the mouse. Death still is  bad for the mouse, and harming the mouse does count for something, morally speaking.

How we behave towards an animal should depend on whether we can easily avoid harming it and whether the benefit we derive from harming it outweighs the harm done to it (thus, Kraut says, controlled experiments on mice to save human lives are justified). Kraut holds that while we normally judge how well a dog is doing by dog standards rather than human standards, we can compare how well a human is doing and how well a dog is doing and point out that a good human life is better than a good canine life. He argues well against those who think otherwise, but crosses the line to counter-intuitiveness when he suggests that a perfectly healthy human being is healthier than a perfectly healthy dog. In addition to not killing them we treat people as autonomous agents in a variety of other ways -- because, says Kraut, it is generally good for them. His arguments to this effect recalls On Liberty at times. I am not sure, though, that the "more to lose" criterion works for harms other than killing. If my cat is so disadvantaged by being a cat, wouldn't taking away her toy be a worse offense than stealing my fifth copy of Nicomachean Ethics, seeing that she has so little in her life?

These are of course only some of the topics tackled by Kraut (as I said, he is quite systematic in his survey of supposedly "good, period" things) and only a small portion of the questions his account raises. This book should be read by anyone who is interested in absolute goodness.