Against Autonomy: Justifying Coercive Paternalism

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Sarah Conly, Against Autonomy: Justifying Coercive Paternalism, Cambridge University Press, 2012, 212pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107024847.

Reviewed by Gerald Dworkin, University of California, Davis


First they came for the smokers . . . .Then they came for the soda . . . . Then they came for the trans-fats . . . .

The topic of state paternalism has gained increasing attention with the increased efforts by states and municipalities to regulate the consumption of unhealthy foods. The philosophical community owes Mayor Bloomberg a debt for his one-man efforts to regulate the addition of trans-fats in New York City restaurants, to post calorie information and his latest -- recently overturned -- ban on the sale of soda in larger than 16 oz servings. I haven't done the search but my guess is that John Stuart Mill has not been quoted so often since the Wolfenden report recommended homosexuality be legalised.

The subject of paternalism is not only of interest to applied philosophers for it deals with theoretical subjects such as the nature of autonomy and liberty, the good of persons, prudence, self-knowledge, the principles governing the use of coercion, the justification of state punishment, and the limits of what we may consent to.

Much of the increased attention to paternalism comes from the growth of research in the behavioural sciences on the many ways in which our cognitive and affective capacities are flawed and limited: Kahneman's dual-process model of the mind (fast and slow), framing, availability heuristic, anchoring effects, priming; judges whose decisions are affected by whether they are made after lunch or before; students whose rates of walking down a hall are affected by whether they look at words such as Florida, forgetful, gray as opposed to ball, thinking, blue; people who think the probability of an earthquake in California is greater than the probability of an earthquake in the United States; people who eat more when the food is served on larger plates.

The first theorists to hop on these findings were the Nudgers. Cass Sunstein and Richard Thaler -- lawyer and economist respectively -- argued for what they labeled Libertarian Paternalism. This was the view that since people were such bad decision makers we should nudge them in the direction of their own desired goals by orchestrating their choices so that they were more likely to do the "good" thing. By making employee retirement plans an "opt-out" rather than "opt-in" scheme employees would be more likely to be in such programs. By putting the healthy food at eye level, and the bad stuff at a lower level, kids in the school cafeteria would be more likely to choose the healthy stuff. Look Ma, no coercion! Hence Libertarian Paternalism.

Sarah Conly's is the first full-length, philosophical exploration and defense of a much broader, and coercive, paternalism. She wants to defend the use of State power to insure that people lead lives that are more likely to achieve their own goals and ends. Conly believes that the empirical facts about defects in human rationality should lead us to be more willing to use coercion than we have thought. In her own words, "paternalism is more justified than we normally think. We know now that we are intractably irrational, and this can't be rectified by simple care and introspection." (p. 7).

The book has seven chapters. Conly devotes the first to the empirical findings about rational decision making, the alternative policy proposals such as nudges, providing information, incentives for change, etc. In addition she considers various arguments against coercive paternalism -- treating people like children, failing to show respect for autonomy -- and argues that they fail. In the next two chapters she argues against the view that the costs of paternalistic policies -- psychological, sociological -- are not likely to outweigh their benefits.

In Chapters 4 and 5 Conly considers the possible dangers of paternalism such as the imposition of values on persons, the political dangers of giving the State too much power, the imposition of penal sanctions to make paternalistic measures feasible, loss of privacy as the bureaucracy learns more about us. She argues that such dangers are either unlikely or that we can control them. In Chapter 6 she looks at the practical application of paternalism in various areas, particularly health policy. In Chapter 7 she deals with the question of where to draw the line between legitimate and illegitimate spheres of paternalistic interference.

This is a well-written, thoughtful, informed treatment of its topic. One test of the quality of a book's argumentation is to see, when a doubt arises in your mind about some claim, whether the author, at some point, addresses it. Conly passes this test with high marks. To give one example, when, early on, she discusses coercing people she does not raise the question of whether it is fair to punish people whose crime is that they are imprudent. I looked in the index to see if the issue was going to be discussed later. It was.

I turn now to more detailed discussion.

* * * * * * * *

The first issue is a rather underappreciated difficulty for paternalists who are in favor of using the criminal law to promote individual well-being -- punishment. If one is a libertarian paternalist the issue does not arise. While the design of our choice architecture might be accused of various sins -- the most obvious being manipulation since it works at a level that individuals are not conscious of, and might not work if they were -- being unfair or unjust is not one of them. Paternalists, such as Conly, are prepared (assuming non-coercive methods did not work as efficiently) to make some self-regarding actions (insert the usual yadda, yadda here about how there are no such things, etc.) the object of criminal sanctions. This implies two features. First, the sanctions can be quite unpleasant (heavy fines and imprisonment) and there is stigma and condemnation. The law says "Don't"; it says if you do bad things will happen to you; it says you are to be condemned for being the kind of person who would do these things.

The proposed justifications for imposing such sanctions on people who behave in certain ways include making it less likely that the offender will repeat the conduct, deterring people other than the offender from doing these things, giving the person what he deserves, allowing the society to condemn the person and the activity, educating and rehabilitating the offender. Because of the harm to the punished, individual theorists of punishment have argued for certain features that criminalized conduct must possess. The conduct must be harmful to others,[1] it must be wrongful, it must satisfy certain mens rea conditions, it must not be excused or justified.

The paternalist alters the first to include harm to self. The question I am raising is which of the other conditions must be altered as well, and the costs of doing so. Conly is aware of some of the problems but does not really confront them:

[a second] troubling thing about punishment for violating paternalistic regulations is that it appears undeserved, in some sense of undeserved: cognitive bias is not typically brought about through the cultivation of vice, or even the failure to cultivate virtue . . . we would like to think that it is at least necessary for punishment that the person who is punished had some sort of ill intent. (127)

This makes it seem as if the problem with punishing imprudent behavior is similar to that of strict liability offenses, or negligence crimes. But the problem here is much deeper. It is the issue of whether imprudent behavior (including intentional imprudent behavior such as climbing Mount Everest) is a proper subject of State condemnation and painful sanctions.

If someone complains about being punished for reckless driving the reply is that you put your fellow citizens at risk of death. You have failed to show proper respect for the personhood of others. You have crossed a boundary that allows us to use you to deter others, as well as yourself, in the future.

If someone protests that they are being punished for not wearing a motorcycle helmet the paternalist's reply is that you put yourself at risk of death. You have failed to show proper respect for yourself. So, we are entitled to use you in the same way as we use bank robbers -- to deter them and others from repeating the behavior. It seems a stretch.

This is not the parodic argument: "Oh, look you have put yourself at risk of harm so we will condemn you and definitely harm you. That'll teach you." It's an argument to the effect that punishment ought to be reserved for those acts that are wrong and harmful to others, not those that are imprudent and harmful to the self. Not because punishment won't work to curb imprudent behavior, but because it is not appropriate. It is not appropriate, among other reasons, because the person is not blameworthy or to be censured for acting imprudently.

Conly, after quoting my distinction between "pure" and "impure" paternalism -- in the latter we interfere with you because you provide a means of harm to those who wish to have those means at their disposal -- says that she agrees we often should not pursue the individuals who are harming themselves. She says "Instead of pursuing suspected cigarette smokers with nicotine detectors, we should make the production and importation of cigarettes illegal" (130). I agree this is an improvement but the difficult questions do not disappear. When the cigarette manufacturer complains "Why are you putting me in jail for supplying people who want my product, seek it out and pay large sums of money for it?" the reply is "They are not very good decision makers, and we want to prevent them from harming themselves in the long run. So we are condemning and harming you as the most efficient way of doing this."

Perhaps the best way of defending paternalistic punishment is via the idea that there is a principle of justice that requires all to comply with laws that are justifiable as efficient means to the promotion of welfare.

Of course, at most what follows from this argument is that we should not punish people for paternalistic reasons. We can still inform, tax, fine, make the activity less attractive in various ways: require a permit, introduce a technological fix (cars won't start unless seatbelts fastened), not allow cyclists injured when not wearing helmets to sue the driver who injured them negligently.

* * * * * * * *

I turn now to Conly's arguments for more paternalistic interferences -- whether through punishment or other means. Her arguments are all consequentialist. In the words of Fitzjames Stephen, the 19th century conservative critic of Mill,

Compulsion is bad:

1. When the object aimed at is bad.

2. When the object aimed at is good, but the compulsion employed is not calculated to obtain it.

3. When the object aimed at is good, and the compulsion employed is calculated to obtain it, but at too great an expense.[2]

For Conly, the good is the good as embraced by the coerced, coercion is good when it is effective in promoting that good better than the coerced can, and the costs of coercion do not outweigh the benefit to the coerced.

She is strongly opposed to regarding liberty as intrinsically good. She recognizes that her opponent, Mill, can be interpreted in two ways. One as pure consequentialist with the promotion of happiness as the standard for right action:

Mill has said that he will not rely on "abstract" ideas of right, distinct from utility. That is, he will not argue that paternalistic intervention is somehow inherently wrong. If it is shown to be wrong, then it must be shown to have bad consequences. (p. 49)

Interpreted this way she is puzzled why the facts of irrationality do not warrant more paternalism than Mill allows.

This is certainly a legitimate way of understanding Mill. My preferred way is to understand Mill as arguing that liberty itself is a constituitive part of the good for persons, understood as "grounded in the permanent interests of man as a progressive being." Such a person

chooses his plan for himself, employs all his faculties. He must use observation to see, reasoning and judgment to foresee, activity to gather materials for decision, discrimination to decide, and when he has decided, firmness and self-control to hold his deliberate decision. And these qualities he requires and exercises exactly in proportion as the part of his conduct which he determines according to his own judgment and feelings is a large one. It is possible that he might be guided in some good path, and kept out of harm's way, without any of these things. But what will be his comparative worth as a human being.[3]

It is this Mill who says things like:

it is the privilege and proper condition of a human being, arrived at the maturity of his faculties, to use and interpret experience in his own way.[4]


If a person possesses any tolerable amount of common sense and experience, his own mode of laying out his existence is the best, not because it is the best in itself, but because it is his own mode.[5]

Conly says she recognizes that "people, do want, among other things, to be free." But this makes the liberty to decide for yourself how you should live just one value among others. It does not recognize the centrality of this value for the "worth" of a human being. And to say that "where liberty is one of the constituents of happiness and thus something that should be promoted, it would make more sense to admit that at times the best way to promote it overall is to curtail it in particular cases" (50) is to assume that promotion is the only proper way to relate to values, as opposed, say, to honoring.

It is also crucial to note what exactly the "it" in the above quote, means. It is not the over-all achievement of the coerced persons's values. It is liberty. But almost all the examples that Conly gives to illustrate justified paternalism are ones where the over-all satisfaction of the agent's desires is maximized by curtailing liberty. If we stop people from drinking sugared beverages it is their health, or longevity, that is promoted. Valuable things to be sure but not their liberty. If one accepted the view that liberty may only be interfered with by a paternalist to promote the greater liberty of the agent there would be far fewer justified interferences than Conly thinks justified.

Now one might argue that the longer one lives the more time one has to exercise one's self-determination and freedom. But, as Conly notes, people are willing to take the risks involved with skiing -- trading off something important to them for the risk of a greatly shortened life.[6] Kal vachomer- as the Talmudists say -- for those who think that a life of greatly increased State coercion is not worth living longer. It does not follow therefore that when we "want to promote happiness, even the "higher quality" happiness he [Mill] champions, it seems that interfering with liberty is sometimes called for." (53) For that assumes Mill's view is a "maximization of liberty" view, as opposed to a view that claims that only a State that adopts institutions which are bound to respect liberty -- except for the familiar harms to others -- can allow individuals of a certain sort, Millian individualists, to flourish.

This brings out an important point about the paternalism debate. It is about facts, and it is about how effective various policies are. But it is crucially about different ideals of the person. Just as defenders of democracy think it important that those who are not well-informed should have the right to vote, so anti-paternalists think those who are bad at making prudential decisions should be allowed to make them. Always? Of course not.

Although Mill never said that people are the best judge of their interests -- what he said was each person is the one most interested in his well-being, and the one who knows best his own feelings and circumstances -- he may have implicitly assumed that each person is best at choosing the means to fulfill his ends. Conly claims, quite rightly in light of the evidence, this is false.

How then are we to choose when to allow people to choose means which will result in quite harmful consequences, and when not to? When, if ever, to not allow people to choose cheaper, but less safe, lawn-mowers? When, if ever, to allow any drug to be sold over-the-counter (with relevant information attached)? When, if ever, to allow cigarettes to be sold? When, if ever, to allow people to heli-ski?

Conly's answer is whenever so doing will maximally secure the agent's ends. Mills' answer is never. For those, such as myself, the answer is, roughly, when the institutions of state power are guided by regulations that are imposed in light of a certain ideal of the person.

As Mill put it:

If it were felt that the free development of individuality is one of the leading essentials of well-being; that it is not only a co-ordinate element with all that is designated by the terms of civilization, instruction, culture, but is itself a necessary part and condition of all those things; there would be no danger that liberty should be undervalued, and the adjustment of the boundaries between it and social control would present no extraordinary difficulty.[7]

[1] This principle has various interpretations. The one I find most useful is by Gardner and Shute. "It is no objection under the harm principle that a harmless action was criminalized, nor even that an action with no tendency to cause harm was criminalized. It is enough to meet the demands of the harm principle that, if the action were not criminalized, that would be harmful." The Wrongness of Rape ", originally in J. H ORDER (ed.), Oxford Essays in Jurisprudence , 4th series, Oxford: OUP, 2000, pp. 193-217.

[2] Fitzjames Stephen, Liberty, Equality, Fraternity ed. R. Posner (Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1991), p.53.

[3] Mill,On Liberty, Ch.III, fourth paragraph

[4] loc. cit, third, paragraph

[5] loc. cit. fourteenth paragraph

[6] Conly does not recognize that these kind of cases are a serious problem for her. Many of her examples are of measures to promote more effective means to people's health. But this is to assume that all (most?) people give health a kind of lexical priority over other ends they have. But consider the following cases:

Jehovah's witnesses who refuse life-saving blood transfusions

Christian Scientists who refuse any medical care

Pregnant women who choose to risk death for the possibility of giving birth to a healthy fetus

Cancer patients who refuse chemotherapy to preserve their fertility

Soldiers who throw themselves on bombs to save their comrades

Ill people who choose to die sooner rather than later, in order to die in a more dignified manner

Athletes who risk their health by taking risky drugs so that they can improve their performance

Competitive eaters who risk choking to death

Physicians who risk their life to prove a scientific hypothesis

Justice Jackson who chose to ignore the warnings that he would die sooner so he could continue his work.

Patients who choose not too have limbs amputated rather than live as amputees

Patients who choose amputation rather than live as non-amputees (Body dysmorphic disorder)

I am not suggesting that these cases are typical ones, nor that they are clearly cases where we should not interfere. We would not want to make social policy based only on cases like these.

But we choose, in the health care context, to give competent patients the absolute right to determine whether, and how, they should be treated. We do this knowing that in some cases their decisions will be counter to their health interests. We do this knowing that in some cases we could protect, and advance, the autonomy of the agent by interference. It is not clear how consequentialists can justify such a right.

[7] Mill, On LIberty, Chapter III, second paragraph