Against Capital Punishment

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Benjamin S. Yost, Against Capital Punishment, Oxford University Press, 2019, 280pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780190901165.

Reviewed by Jeffrey W. Howard, University College London


Benjamin S. Yost has written a meticulously researched and tightly argued treatment of the morality of execution. The standard argument for abolishing the death penalty holds that even when moral agents have culpably perpetrated heinous wrongs, executing them is an unacceptable attack on their dignity, something that even they do not deserve to suffer. Yost is unconvinced by this strategy, which entails, implausibly, that we would wrong the likes of Hitler and Pol Pot by subjecting them to capital sentences. Instead Yost seeks to put the argument for abolition on more secure footing. On his view, what makes execution wrong is, first, the fact that it is irrevocable. While prisoners discovered to be innocent can be freed and compensated, we cannot resurrect the unjustly executed from the grave. But this insight is not enough to vindicate the proceduralist case. The argument requires a further premise, which Yost's book specifies and defends: "the principle of remedy," a fundamental tenet of liberal political morality enjoining political institutions to fix their mistakes. A commitment to this principle militates against execution, Yost argues, since wrongful executions cannot be remedied.

This initial description does not do justice to the exhaustive character of the book. Yost's extended analysis offers rich insights into the principle of lex talionis, the nature of dignity and the right to life, the penal philosophy of Immanuel Kant, the distinction between compensation for punishment and genuine remedy, the nature of irrevocability, the relative disvalue of under-punishment as contrasted with over-punishment, and the nature of uncertainty in legal decision-making -- among many other topics. The argument is systematically prosecuted, with detailed defenses of each premise. The analysis is painstaking, but the reading experience is utterly painless, in light of Yost's elegant writing, which somehow manages to be simultaneously rigorous and relaxed. It is a wonderful read -- and undoubtedly required reading for anyone working on this topic in the future.

Yost's view is not intended to be ecumenical toward all factions in the philosophy of punishment. The central addressees of the argument are retributivists, themselves divided on whether execution is ever justified. Yost himself endorses the claim that there are plausible pro tanto reasons in favor of retaining the death penalty from a retributivist perspective, such that abolition would involve a genuine moral cost: depriving those who deserve execution of their just deserts. This, then, motivates the question: given that there are positive reasons to execute, can these reasons be defeated by countervailing (proceduralist) considerations? Chapters 1 and 2 have the main job of setting out what these pro tanto reasons to execute are. Chapter 3 then defends the claim that execution really is irrevocable. Chapter 4 specifies the central argument for abolition, hinging on the aforementioned principle of remedy and a complementary asymmetry principle (which tells us it's better to risk under-punishment than over-punishment). And Chapter 5 chiefly serves to explore how this argument bests other abolitionist attempts in the literature.

What, exactly, are the reasons in favor of execution? (I will linger on these before proceeding to discuss the proceduralist case that outweighs them.) In Chapter 1, Yost argues that executing killers can be justified as a proportionate punishment (where proportionality is understood in cardinal, rather than ordinal, terms). He defends a particular conception of cardinal proportionality by appealing to the principle of lex talionis, which requires that a punishment "share some of the wrong-making features of the crime it sanctions" (p. 49). Yost argues that we can (and should) endorse this principle without embracing the "clearly impermissible" proposal that we must punish torturers with torture and rapists with rape (p. 48). This is, in part, because we can "abstract from" the grisly details of physical torture and impose non-physically-torturous punishments on torturers that nevertheless are cardinally proportionate (say, a devastating prison sentence); yet when it comes to murder, this crime has a distinctive wrong-making feature -- the removal of life -- that simply cannot be replicated in a non-lethal sentence (p. 57). After defending this position from the objections that execution affronts dignity or otherwise violates the right to life, Yost concludes that retributivist defenders of cardinal proportionality should recognize that execution can indeed be a proportionate punishment.

In Chapter 2, Yost offers a systematic reconstruction of Matthew Kramer's purgative theory of capital punishment, which holds that "defilingly evil" offenders must be executed by a political community (rather than being kept alive by that community) lest it fail to maintain morally proper relations with all of humanity. He proclaims that "Kramer's account is one of the most powerful defenses of capital punishment available" (p. 92), but he also identifies significant vulnerabilities in Kramer's theory -- doubting, for example, that it even can justify its central claim (pp. 89-92). This struck me as a tad discordant, precisely because Yost's objections to Kramer were so convincing. So I am left doubting whether Yost thinks Kramer's view furnishes a genuine pro tanto reason in favor of execution or not. (Yost's concluding discussion here suggests that the purgative theory is better read as a way of explaining why execution can be cardinally proportionate with regard to certain offenders [pp. 92-96] -- but if this is right, then Kramer's view is a way of explicating the previous lex talionis argument from Chapter 1, not furnishing a new reason.) In any case, even if Yost is on the fence about the purgative theory, the discussion here is the most incisive meditation on Kramer's groundbreaking view that I have seen in the literature.

Yost proceeds to shift register, engaging in Kantian exegesis to uncover further putative reasons to execute. He identifies (at least) two reasons in Kant's legal and political thought that militate in favor of retribution. The first is an argument about the importance of punishing in strict accordance with lex talionis (ius talionis for Kant) in high-stakes cases of serious crime, since this putatively helps avoid the risk of punishing incorrectly. The second is an argument about honor. Yost interprets Kant as holding that a fully rational agent would be dishonored by his decision to murder, where honor is a matter of "self-esteem in relation to the moral law" (p. 112). That is because murder is uniquely horrific -- "as close as someone can come to pure evil" (p. 113) -- as it "eliminates freedom with a finality that other crimes cannot achieve" (p. 114). And "by continuing to live with this stain, rather than be put to death, the honorable man is dishonored" (p. 113). As he would rather die than continue to live with that stain, "he welcomes the state's removing the stain on his dignity by taking his life" (p. 115). (Yost casts this argument as showing that punishment is permissible [pp. 111, 116], though this struck me as in tension with his claim that we have a duty to presume that offenders are honorable [pp. 119-120]. If Kant thinks honorable offenders would want to die rather than live on, and if we have a duty to treat them as if they were honorable, a moral imperative to execute plausibly follows.)

So, what should we make of Yost's crucial claim that there is, in fact, a strong retributivist case in favor of execution? It's an important claim, since it motivates his whole argument. While impressed at all turns by his insights here, I was left with mixed feelings. The first point he identifies -- that execution for murderers is cardinally proportionate -- struck me as convincing within a retributivist framework. But the other reasons to execute that Yost canvasses, while wholly intelligible, struck me as difficult to accept. In Kramer's case, this is because of Yost's own criticisms. And in the case of Kant, while Yost's interpretation struck me as both exegetically sound and marvelously interesting, his arguments left me cold. (Consider the second, honor-focused view. Imagine someone you knew engaged in murder, and then, horrified at what she had done, became convinced getting the state to kill her was the right way to make amends. Wouldn't we think she was making a mistake?)

Perhaps I am unconvinced simply because I'm not a retributivist, thanks to the raft of criticisms that have been advanced against retributivism in the literature (e.g., Tadros 2011). Indeed, if Yost is right that there is a powerful retributivist case for execution -- a penalty I intuitively find repellent -- I think this should dispose us to be even more hostile to retributivism. That's not necessarily an objection to Yost, since the world is, alas, filled with retributivists. But the philosophical community is also filled with anti-retributivists, which led me to wonder why Yost was so intent on restricting his audience in the way he does. The condensed discussion on deterrence theory (pp. 33ff) was excellent -- prompting me to want to hear more. For example, Yost avows that deterrence theorists "do not adhere to the principle of remedy" and "scoff at the asymmetry principle" (p. 17) (more on these in a moment) -- and of course that's true for wholehearted consequentialists. But consider Victor Tadros's widely discussed deontological deterrence theory, according to which offenders are liable to suffer punitive harms for the sake of providing security for their victims and others via the mechanism of general deterrence (2011). Tadros's theory takes moral rights seriously -- e.g., fully embracing proportionality limits on punishment (2011, pp. 345ff). But it is ardently non-retributivist (i.e., it is not a "mixed theory" of the kind that Yost mentions on p. 16, which aims at deterrence but wheels in retributivism ad hoc to justify various constraints). It seems plausible that Tadros's theory -- the most significant deterrence theory on the market for deontologists -- could and indeed should embrace the principle of remedy and the asymmetry principle. Were Yost to show us how this were so, this would expand the reach of his core argument -- a victory for his proceduralist cause.

Onto that proceduralist argument. Having identified putative reasons to execute, Yost searches for countervailing considerations. That begins with establishing the irrevocability of execution, the task of Chapter 3. Yost takes seriously the contention that "the death penalty is not irrevocable . . . because the state can compensate wrongly executed people by posthumously advancing their interests" (p. 124). Yost convincingly establishes that this claim is false: to revoke punishment, compensation is not enough. (As Yost notes, the state could incarcerate a citizen unjustly and compensate her handsomely for this fact while continuing to keep her imprisoned [p. 146].) Revocation, crucially, requires the citizen to regain control of her life, so that she is free to pursue her conception of the good. That cannot happen from the grave.

But this inspires an objection. Suppose someone is unjustly incarcerated for a period of time and dies during that period. Isn't revocation impossible here, too? Yes, Yost admits, but only in a weak sense. If someone has a heart attack during his prison sentence, and then the injustice of his conviction is later discovered, the punishment is irrevocable. But the punishment did not, by its nature, cause this to be the case. (Imagine a week-long prison sentence; is this irrevocable, and so impermissible, simply because a heart attack is possible within that week?) Intriguingly, Yost concedes that some other punishments might be irrevocable in a strong, causal sense -- e.g., "Someone who undergoes extended periods of solitary confinement interrupted only by torture and a minimum of sustenance may suffer so much psychological damage that he cannot go on in any self-directed way" (p. 153). Yost thinks this is a feature, not a bug, of his view, since he sees torturous punishments as impermissible. This is slipped in as a caveat, but it struck me as a deep insight. Given the devastatingly brutal form of incarceration that prevails in the U.S. and many other countries -- one that can make it extraordinarily difficult for prisoners to regain a sense of self-determination once on the outside -- I suspect Yost's argument has much more radical implications for carceral reform than he lets on. Indeed, his perhaps undue concern with showing that his argument only condemns execution may have led him to overlook this point.

The crown jewel of the book is Chapter 4, where the core proceduralist case is advanced. (Chapter 5, which is well worth one's time but which I will not address here, diligently explores distinct abolitionist arguments in the literature, which Yost believes prove either too little -- e.g., calling only for a moratorium on execution, say, until its racist tendencies can be eliminated -- or too much -- e.g., calling for the abolition of all punishments in light of authorities' fallibility.) The argumentative case of Chapter 4 is scrupulously prosecuted and highly persuasive. As I have mentioned, the central principle defended here is the principle of remedy, which Yost also terms the "get it right or fix your mistake" principle (p. 164). This principle flows from a basic assumption: "If a liberal state must abstain from unjust coercion" -- as it surely must -- "it must also endeavor to alleviate all those illicit burdens it does impose . . . To fail to try to put things aright evinces a callousness to injustice that, if not equivalent in countenancing the original wrongful act, stands in close proximity" (p. 160). This principle, Yost shows, is rightly embedded in our political and legal practice.

But to arrive at an all-things-considered condemnation of execution, the principle of remedy is not enough. Because of the existence of moral reasons to execute, we need to show that it is worth the price of abolition to deprive those who do deserve execution of their just deserts. Thus Yost sets out to show why we should prefer under-punishment rather than over-punishment. More precisely: "It is better to risk underpunishment of P by n units than to risk the overpunishment of P by n units and the failure to remedy P for such overpunishment" (p. 171). The bulk of this chapter makes the case for this claim (first in an approximated form, and finally in a more refined form cashed out in terms of risk). Yost first explores the idea that under-punishment is better than over-punishment because under-punishment is a "free-floating" wrong, whereas over-punishment is both a wrong to the offender and a harm (p. 190), and so is worse. Yost grants that this view rests on controversial assumptions, so he proceeds to supplement it with a view he prefers, which is tethered to a convincing "minimal invasion principle", according to which authorities must always pursue the least invasive of all available techniques for pursuing a legitimate state aim (p. 193). In a nutshell (though this skates over some details): when faced with the choice between risking under-punishing and risking over-punishing, the former is less invasive. This supplies a decisive moral reason to prefer the former to the latter.

There are many other steps in this intricate argument. For example, Yost confronts "the prospect of occasions when sentencers are, with good reason, supremely confident that the defendant is guilty of a defilingly evil offense" (p. 208). In response, Yost goes to great lengths to show how "every capital proceeding [is] marked by higher-order uncertainty" (p. 219), which is "constituted by our inability to distinguish between cases in which first-order uncertainty" (e.g., whether we can trust the results from the crime lab) "is present, and those in which it is not" (p. 209). This seemed like a stretch; had Hitler been apprehended and tried, it does not seem plausible that the trial would have been afflicted with higher-order uncertainty. Accordingly, Yost's closing sentiments in this chapter seem to me to be more convincing: "proceduralist arguments are tailored to the world we inhabit, not near-ideal worlds orbiting thought experiments" (p. 222). The fact that nearly all trials are suffused with higher-order uncertainty is enough to justify a rule of regulation forbidding capital sentences (especially since the mere existence of capital punishment as a legal option to be reserved for those rare justified cases will surely increase its unjustified use).

In closing, I want to sketch a worry: that the argument proves too much. Yost justifies his principle of remedy by appealing to the fundamental principle that the state should refrain from unjust coercion -- and so be ready and willing to remedy its mistakes when it does engage in unjust coercion. By executing people who might be innocent, the state rules out that possibility. This principle applies most clearly to decisions by legal institutions, but this is only one application. Consider an active shooter situation in which it is reported that a gunman is running amok at a local mall, in a jurisdiction with many gun owners. The police show up on the scene. They identify the person they think is the shooter, whom (they think) is liable to be shot in virtue of forfeiting his rights through an unjust attack. But alas: they mistakenly shoot the wrong person. Perhaps the mistake was even subjectively justified. Still, surely the state owes a remedy; imagine, after all, if the mistaken police victim had lived. But alas: it's not possible, as he has died. Does Yost thereby condemn the use of lethal defensive force by state agents -- either in police or military settings -- since these occasions are often suffused with uncertainty? His brief comments that relate to this topic (pp. 60-61) suggest he countenances the possibility of justified killing in self-defense and war. But why, when remedy for mistakes is ruled impossible?

Yost's book is the most powerful treatment of the procedural argument against execution in the scholarly literature. Its intricate arguments richly repay close study. In light of the injustice of capital punishment, we can only hope that Yost's arguments will serve as potent intellectual ammunition for the righteous citizens fighting tirelessly for abolition. I recommend the book wholeheartedly.


Tadros, V. 2011. The Ends of Harm: The Moral Foundations of Criminal Law. Oxford: Oxford University Press.