Against Coherence: Truth, Probability, and Justification

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Erik Olsson, Against Coherence: Truth, Probability, and Justification, Oxford University Press, 2005, 248pp, $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199279993.

Reviewed by Michael Huemer, University of Colorado


Erik Olsson's Against Coherence poses a powerful challenge to coherence theories of justification, from the standpoint of probabilistic epistemology. Olsson focuses on attempts to show that coherence is "truth-conducive", meaning that the coherence of a belief system contributes to its probability of being accurate. Ultimately, he finds that a high degree of coherence cannot secure a high probability of truth, nor does greater coherence in general imply a greater likelihood of truth, even ceteris paribus.

In the first part of the book, Olsson confronts attempts by C.I. Lewis, Laurence BonJour, and C.A.J. Coady to use coherence to justify our ordinary beliefs derived, respectively, from memory, sense perception, and testimony. He takes as a starting point an illustration employed by both Lewis and BonJour, in which witnesses of doubtful reliability independently agree on a number of specific details about a crime. Intuitively, the witnesses' agreement constitutes strong evidence that the story to which they attest is the truth. Similarly, the coherence of a set of independently acquired beliefs is thought to provide justification for thinking that those beliefs are by and large true. As Olsson shows, however, this intuitive result holds only as long as each witness has at least some degree of individual credibility (meaning that receiving the testimony of one witness raises the probability of what the witness asserts). This fact creates a problem for BonJour, who sought to justify external-world beliefs solely on the basis of coherence, without the need for individual credibility. Once we grant individual credibility to some external world beliefs, we have abandoned a central motivation for coherentism and fallen into what BonJour called "weak foundationalism".

Even if we accept some degree of individual credibility, as both Lewis and Coady do, two problems remain. First, how likely it is that a coherent set of beliefs is accurate depends on the degree of individual credibility of those beliefs, and neither Lewis nor Coady provide any way of determining the relevant degrees of credibility. Without this, they lack a convincing reply to the skeptic, since they cannot show that beliefs based on memory or testimony are sufficiently probable to pass the threshold for justified belief. Second, neither Lewis, nor Coady, nor BonJour provides arguments to justify the needed assumption that the "reports" generated by our cognitive faculties are probabilistically independent of each other. As Olsson notes, this assumption is particularly problematic in the case of memory beliefs, which do in fact influence each other (if one "remembers" that P, whether correctly or not, one is more likely to "remember" other things consistent with P). While Olsson is correct that none of the authors he critiques have shown the relevant forms of skepticism to be false, those authors may nevertheless have accomplished something of value: they have explained how our beliefs could be justified, in the face of skeptical arguments to the contrary. If we place the burden of proof on the skeptic, this kind of reply may be all we need.

In the second part of the book, Olsson addresses himself to the effort to define a measure of coherence on which more coherent belief systems are, ceteris paribus, more likely to be true. It is here that he reveals his most dramatic result: Olsson shows that, subject to several seemingly reasonable assumptions, it is impossible to define any such measure. Taking truth-conduciveness as essential to the concept of coherence, he concludes that coherence does not exist. Alternately, we might say that while coherence exists, it cannot satisfy the epistemological hopes that made us interested in it. As with most formal results applied to philosophical issues, the crucial questions concern the assumptions on which the proof rests. Olsson uses the following assumptions.

1. Individual Credibility: The cases of interest concern agreement among information sources with some degree of individual credibility -- that is, the probability of each source reporting accurately should be better than chance.

2. Conditional Independence: The reports of these information sources are probabilistically independent of each other, given the facts (that is, the probability of one source reporting that P, given that P is true, is unaffected by what the other sources report; and the probability of one source reporting that P, given that P is false, is unaffected by what the other sources report).

3. Probability Functionality: The degree of coherence of a collection of reports should be a function of the probabilities of the propositions the reports are about and their boolean combinations.

4. The Independence Criterion: Coherence is truth-conducive ceteris paribus only if, whenever all factors that are independent of coherence are held fixed, the more coherent set of reports is more likely to be entirely correct.

Given these assumptions, Olsson's conclusion that coherence is not truth-conducive follows. Should we accept these assumptions?

Olsson sees the assumptions of Individual Credibility and Conditional Independence as friendly to the coherentist. As the discussion of BonJour reveals, it is doubtful whether a genuine coherentist can embrace Individual Credibility, and permitting the coherentist this assumption is something of a generous concession. Likewise, Conditional Independence seems to be an assumption that the coherentist would like to make, though it is questionable whether the coherentist can justify it; this too seems to be a generous concession to the coherentist.

However, while Olsson is correct that, given Conditional Independence, the coherentist must assume Individual Credibility, he overlooks one way in which a coherentist could simultaneously reject Conditional Independence and Individual Credibility. A coherentist could suppose that the probabilistic relevance of one information source's report to that of another is greater given that the reports are true than it is given that they are false (that is, that P(R2|R1,A) > P(R2|R1,~A), where R1 is the proposition that the first source reports that A, and R2 is the proposition that the second source reports that A). This assumption allows the occurrence of a pair of agreeing reports to confirm the truth of what is reported, even if neither report individually provides evidence of what is reported. However, it is no clearer how a coherentist could justify this assumption than it is how one could justify the joint assumption of Conditional Independence and Individual Credibility.

The assumption of Probability Functionality -- that any measure of coherence should be definable solely in terms of the probabilities of the contents of a set of reports and their boolean combinations -- is also open to question. The intuition seems to be that coherence is a matter of how well beliefs support each other and that support can be understood probabilistically. However, coherentists have posited other constituents of coherence, such as explanatory connections among beliefs, which may not be reducible to probabilistic features of the set of believed propositions. To this objection, Olsson might reply that mutual support is at least an important form of coherence, and thus that his argument shows at least that one important form of coherence is not truth-conducive. A more serious worry for Olsson is that in the sort of witness scenarios he discusses, it seems that coherence can depend partly on facts about the sources of a set of reports, and not only on the propositional contents of the reports. For instance, suppose that a single witness tells an improbable and incoherent story. Intuitively, he cannot substantially increase the coherence of his testimony merely by repeating the story several times. But if several different sources all tell this initially improbable story, their reports then seem to provide an impressive example of coherence. The assumption of Probability Functionality would incorrectly rule these two situations equivalent with respect to degree of coherence, since we have the same propositions reported.

There are also grounds for questioning the Independence Criterion for ceteris paribus claims. As Olsson would have it, the claim that quantity F is ceteris paribus conducive to quantity G entails that there can be no pair of cases in which (i) all factors that are independent of F are equal, (ii) F is greater in one case than in the other, and yet (iii) G is smaller in the former case than in the latter. Now consider a situation in which G is causally determined by two factors, E and F, in such a way that G = 2E + F. Suppose further that F is causally determined by two factors, D and E, in such a way that F = D + E. Intuitively, in such a situation we should say that F is ceteris paribus conducive to G. It also seems that neither D nor E is independent of F, since they jointly determine F. Now consider the following two possible cases:

Case 1: D=2 and E=2. Consequently, F=4 and G=8.

Case 2: D=4 and E=1. Consequently, F=5 and G=7.

F increases from Case 1 to Case 2, but G decreases (there is no need to hold D or E fixed, since neither is independent of F); therefore, the Independence Criterion incorrectly dictates that F is not conducive to G, even ceteris paribus.

This creates a problem for Olsson's thesis of the impossibility of a truth-conducive measure of coherence. Tomoji Shogenji's proposed measure of coherence, according to which the degree of coherence of a set of propositions {A1, … , An} is equal to P(A1 & … & An) / [P(A1) × … × P(An)], has the consequence that a more coherent set of propositions is more likely to be true, provided the individual prior probabilities of the members of the set (P(A1), …, P(An)) are held fixed. It is by means of the Independence Criterion that Olsson hopes to disqualify this would-be counter-example to his own thesis: because the individual prior probabilities of the Ai are not independent of coherence, Olsson denies that they should be held fixed in assessing the truth-conduciveness of coherence. Conversely, if we reject the Independence Criterion, Shogenji's measure looks like a counter-example to Olsson's thesis.

Olsson concludes with his most speculative chapter, one in which a pragmatist response to skepticism, inspired in part by C.S. Pierce, is proposed in place of the coherentist approach. This response begins with the observation that, when we confront the skeptic, we inevitably start from our common-sense belief system; the skeptic, therefore, must somehow persuade us to doubt those beliefs. Olsson urges that we cannot simply doubt our beliefs at will, and that we can be made to doubt what we believe only if (i) we encounter new and surprising evidence, (ii) we find that our current theory fails to explain something that an alternative theory explains, or (iii) we discover that some of the things we believe support an alternative theory as against one of our current theories. As Olsson argues, our encounters with philosophical skeptics bring about none of these conditions.

The claim that (i), (ii), and (iii) are the only possible causes of doubt is dubious, apparently resting more on Olsson's unsuccessful attempt to think of any further possible causes of doubt than on any theoretical reason why such further causes could not exist. It is also less than pellucid what conclusion follows, if we grant the claim. The conclusion would seem to be that philosophical skeptics never in fact succeed in inducing doubts about common-sense beliefs. This is sadly untrue, as most teachers of undergraduate epistemology can attest. Moreover, even if it were true, our inability to doubt certain beliefs would not refute the skeptic's contention that those beliefs are epistemically unjustified or otherwise fail to qualify as knowledge. So perhaps we should interpret the crucial premise as the claim that conditions (i), (ii), and (iii) exhaust the kinds of rational grounds one can have for doubting one's beliefs. To this, the skeptic might object that Olsson's list of rational grounds for doubt is incomplete, since the skeptical arguments themselves are examples of rational grounds for doubt that Olsson's list does not cover.

In the end, Olsson's arguments against coherentism and skepticism are inconclusive. They nevertheless point up the inadequacy of previous defenses of coherentism and pose an important dialectical challenge that coherentists must confront. One who wishes to defend the coherence theory in the face of Olsson's attack will need to articulate notions of coherence and of truth-conduciveness that avoid the assumptions leading to Olsson's impossibility theorem. The coherentist will then need to construct new arguments that the conditions required for coherence to be truth-conducive are in fact satisfied in typical cases of epistemological interest. As Olsson shows us, it is not sufficient to rely on vague intuitions about coherence and probability. Anyone interested in the coherence theory or in probabilistic approaches to epistemology needs to attend closely to Olsson's careful and extremely important work.