Against Democracy

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Jason Brennan, Against Democracy, Princeton University Press, 2016, 288pp., $18.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780691178493.

Reviewed by Thomas Christiano, University of Arizona


Jason Brennan's book is a lively and entertaining exploration of an important pair of questions: (1) how can democracies work when the citizens who are supposed to rule are not very well informed about the substance and form of government and policy? and, (2) can we do better with non-democratic government? The basic difficulty with Brennan's discussion is that he is inclined to proceed from a poorly understood micro-theory of democracy to conclusions about how well democracy works. He doesn't always hold to this -- indeed there are times when he suggests that democracies overall work pretty well and then wonders how this is possible -- but the main thrust of the book starts from the micro-theory, which is simply not strong enough to bear the weight of his argument.

The basic structure of the argument is that individuals in democracies have very little if any power in collective decision-making and so have very little incentive to become well-informed about matters of collective concern. As a consequence, some are simply completely uninformed, while others are informed but highly irresponsible users of information, since there are no opportunity costs. Both of these groups participate in politics, though the second more than the first. These people are all incompetent but for somewhat different reasons. The first group know nothing, while the second, knowing a bit but being carried away by emotions connected with a kind of tribal partisanship, tend towards highly biased ideas and are unwilling to listen to others. Brennan calls these two groups 'hobbits' and 'hooligans' (pp. 4-5). Since democracy is understood to be rule by ordinary people, the idea is that democracy involves rule by hobbits and hooligans (mostly the latter) and the consequence is incompetent rule.

But the problems do not end there. Brennan's further claim is that democracy tends to encourage people who actively participate to be hooligans and thus to turn their political opponents into enemies. People who might otherwise be friends or engage in productive economic interaction turn out to hate each other and thus give up the opportunity to engage in these interactions (p. 230). Hence we have the combination of incompetent rule and lost economic and other associational opportunities. Here, Brennan reverses the two main arguments Mill offered in favor of democracy and returns to Hobbes's and Plato's arguments against democracy. Brennan supports his position with a diverse body of evidence. There are election studies that attempt to measure people's political knowledge and consistently show that political knowledge is sorely lacking among American citizens (pp. 25-26). There is evidence suggesting that the processes of deliberation on which many have pinned hopes of a democratic revival can often actually exacerbate conflict among persons and increase the levels of their biases (pp. 62-67). There is some evidence suggesting the presence of the process called 'group polarization' in deliberative contexts.

Brennan seems to undergird these observations with a version of Anthony Downs' theory of how citizens economize on information-gathering costs. This version of Downs' view asserts that since the chance of having any significant impact on the outcome of an election is so small, people have very little incentive to know much about politics because the value of such knowledge is so heavily discounted by the small chance of an impact. This is thought to explain the hobbits. The hooligans, who are informed to some extent, are explained by tribalism as it applies to persons of one's own political persuasion. This explanation suggests that people develop their views irresponsibly and without regard to other views, while demonizing people of other persuasions. The quality of thinking is pretty low, or so Brennan infers.

To be sure, Brennan recognizes that the above reasoning has limits since he affirms that people generally participate in politics in order to pursue the common good. This introduces a great deal of vagueness into the discussion because though the chance of having an impact is very small, the size of the impact could be enormous to me if I am seriously interested in the common good and think that one alternative has a significant advantage with respect to the common good. How strong is the inclination to be concerned with the common good? If it is pretty strong, then the purported explanation of hobbits and hooligans loses steam. If it is strong with some people and not with others, then we have a lot of uncertain effects. These issues are not pursued or even broached.

Now we might think that the evidence supports the hooligans and hobbits hypothesis but here Brennan tends systematically to overplay the negative evidence and underplay the more positive evidence. The researchers that he refers to in support of his claims tend to take much more nuanced positions than Brennan does. The evidence on deliberation is usually described as "mixed", not as all or even mostly negative. It is negative relative to the hopes of some deliberative theorists perhaps. But the researchers seem to see a fair amount of positive effects of deliberation and they emphasize the sensitivity of the quality of deliberation to context and recommend that the design of deliberative institutions take this into account. Of course, for the most part, researchers on these subjects tend to emphasize how little we still know about deliberative processes. Furthermore, the evidence of deliberative polls and mini-publics, which Brennan mentions and then passes over mostly in silence, has tended to show quite positive effects of having people at least listen to diverse groups of experts.

Brennan also spends far too little time on one form of information-economizing that Downs and more recent political scientists have discussed and analyzed with some care: the process of information shortcuts. People use shortcuts in all walks of life and in every aspect of their lives. Going to the doctor is a shortcut compared to studying for the rest of my life how my body works. Going to a mechanic is a shortcut compared to learning a lot about how cars work. In a society with such a complex division of labor such as our own, economic life and political life would grind to a halt if it were required that people know a lot about the things they depend on. It is well known that people are strikingly ignorant of what is in their toothpaste, their cars, their financial arrangements, and their bodies, just to start an endless list. Does this mean that they act on the basis of no information? No. It implies that they act on the basis of other people's beliefs and statements about these matters while not knowing or even understanding the bases of those beliefs. If they really had to figure those things out on their own, they would not have the time to do their jobs or take care of their families. Furthermore, people rely on other people to act as alarm bells when a given shortcut is not working well. Given each person's reliance on others' beliefs, the big question is this: are economic and political relations between persons arranged so that the shortcuts they use to determine how to act and to signal that some of their other shortcuts are failing can actually help them navigate well through life?

Let us briefly consider the evidence about political ignorance. It tends to show that somewhere between one-third to two-thirds of people give incorrect answers to certain significant questions about politics. The methodology of these surveys can be and has been questioned of course. But even if the methodology is right, the surveys do not show that people's actions are based on bad information. Because, as Downs argues, they may be acting on the basis of their well-informed friends' views or the views of opinion leaders they trust, and so may not be able to answer questions because they rely on others. To be sure, this is risky because the shortcuts may be corrupt, but the system has other shortcuts, sometimes called 'alarm bells', for determining this as well. There are some people who know a lot about some given area and they blow the whistle on charlatans. That this kind of activity is going on and that it is based on a large scale institutional structure that is designed to generate information is made plain by the huge investment in the generation of knowledge that goes on in democratic societies and the great investment made to package that information in ways that are easily digested and useable by ordinary citizens. Newspapers, universities, think tanks, more specialized magazines, academic journals and the operations of political parties and partisan interest groups make no sense unless this process is going on. I do not want to say all is well, but I do want to say that the micro-theory that Brennan utilizes is woefully underpowered for figuring out what is going on in democratic societies. Here I think those theorists who take their inspiration from Downs' idea of rational ignorance should go back and look carefully at the really interesting theory he generates about the processes of information transmission in a democratic society.

Why is all this a problem for Brennan's approach? The answer starts from the observation that the modern democratic societies of Europe, North America, and East Asia have actually been quite successful; and the democratic element in them is a large part of what seems to explain that. First, there is a great deal of data marking out the remarkable differences between reasonably high quality democracies and other kinds of societies. Brennan mentions these but I don't think he takes the full measure of the evidence. Democracies do not go to war with one another and respect the rules of war better than other societies.  They are responsible for the creation of the international trade system, the international environmental law system, and the human rights regime.  In fact, democracies do massively better on basic human rights than other societies, and it appears to be more their majoritarian character that explains this than their systems of checks and balances. Democracies prevent famines and, since the onset of universal suffrage, have developed powerful welfare states that have been enormously productive, have greatly reduced poverty, and have smoothed out the disastrous economic crises that occurred in their more free market ancestor societies.  Further, they have generally protected the interests of workers and lower economic classes, done a better job at producing public goods than other societies and generally have higher rates of per capita growth than their free market ancestors. Most of us hope for much more progress than this, but these achievements are extraordinary and are hard to square with the idea that hooligans and hobbits are at the helm.

Admittedly, Brennan's argument is comparative. He argues that democracy may do less well than what he calls "epistocracy" or rule by experts or knowers. And he pleads that there have been no epistocracies, so we don't really know how the comparison would go. But this is not quite true. We have had experience of societies that thought of themselves as epistocracies. One example is the Soviet Union and its satellite states, and another is the People's Republic of China. Here the ruling elites claim to know better than others the true interests of the members of society (what else could an epistocracy be but a self-proclaimed one?) And these were societies devoted to the welfares of their populations, at least ostensibly. They were mostly disasters on all the grounds mentioned above. The People's Republic of China may do better in some ways. I guess we'll see. But we have other evidence as well. After all, the limited franchise of European societies in the nineteenth century could be and was justified on epistocratic grounds. The wealthy and propertied classes held power while workers and peasants did not. The former group were well educated while the latter were not, and the former group claimed to act for the good of all. What happened? They were much poorer, they experienced famines and slower rates of per capita growth, and they violently suppressed the rights of their working populations. Obviously these societies were in earlier stages of development so the evidence is unclear, but it would be useful to consider these cases as possible instances of the sort of thing Brennan is proposing.

Two things stand out from this comparison. First, democratic societies are pretty competently run and comparatively successful and nonviolent. Second, the success cannot be attributed merely to elites acting well. The success is owed in significant part to the fact that democratic societies are responsive to the interests of their most vulnerable populations. This suggests that the lower economic strata are having some kind of influence on the functioning of these governments that ensures the protection of their basic interests and that they would not see this kind of protection if they were not included. The evidence is not conclusive, but it is enough to make one seriously question the thesis that the society is run by hobbits and hooligans. It does suggest that the rather limited micro-theory on which Brennan relies is probably off course and that a lot more attention needs to be paid to the fine grain of democratic institutions, formal and informal.

The point that democracies work well in part by giving lower income and minority groups power is important to stress. Brennan seems to work on the unargued assumption that democracy doesn't do any good for the less well off and minorities because they tend to be less well informed. It seems plausible to think that less information leads to less power, as Downs asserted. But the macro-level evidence rather strongly suggests that the less well off and minorities are benefitted at least by reasonably high quality democracies. I think this is an essential part of any justification of democracy, whether it is of its intrinsic or its instrumental value. Democracy has intrinsic value to the extent that it distributes power widely to all the sectors of society. The intrinsic value is the value of the equal distribution of the instrumentally valuable political power.

By the way, the symbolic value of democracy as expressing the equal status of persons also depends on this instrumental value. Here Brennan stumbles; he seems to think that there are people who think that democracy can have value merely by having laws that assert that people are equal regardless of the effects on people's lives (p. 128). But the arguments of Rawls and myself assume that the expressive value piggy-backs on instrumental value. The idea is that if having political power enables people to advance their interests, then depriving them of that political power expresses the idea that their interests are of little or no consequence. Now, one might ask: what do the intrinsic value and the expressive values add? They add something because there is a great deal of indeterminacy in determining how much people's legitimate interests are being advanced, even though it is clear that political power does advance interests. The egalitarian intrinsic value presupposes the instrumental value but cannot be entirely replaced by it. The reason for the indeterminacy is another feature that Brennan's discussion gives far too little weight to: the fact that there is a great deal of disagreement about what is a proper way to treat people as free and equal in the substance of policy. As a consequence there is not enough society-wide agreement to determine when people are being treated as equals or not. The way to resolve the society-wide disagreement is by giving people an equal amount of political power, which is known to help people advance their interests. It is no objection to this view to say, as Brennan does, that people are actually concerned with the common good and not with advancing their interests. We can all agree on this and that people have duties to advance the common good, but we can still recognize the ubiquitous facts of persons' biases towards conceptions of the common good that are connected with their own interests and distinctive experiences in society. This is why, while everyone has a duty to advance the common good, they also have an interest in doing this in a context in which they have equal power. And it is why a system that fails to accord equal power is publicly treating some groups as inferiors.

If the above is right, then Brennan's suggestion that the worse off ought to be deprived of the vote or of equal power because they are less well informed seems to involve taking from those who have less and giving to those who have more. Any society that actually does this strongly suggests that the interests of these people matter less, and that suggestion is attached to a high probability that their interests will be neglected at best and at worst pushed aside when there is conflict. One possible solution to the problem of worse off people being less well informed is to design institutions that help them get better informed. Brennan notes but does not do much to try to understand why it is that affluent people are better informed about politics than the less affluent. This is a quite systematic phenomenon in modern democracies. Downs thinks this is partly explained by their superior education, partly by the fact that the opportunity cost of becoming informed is lower for affluent people. But another key factor is that most affluent people receive a lot of free political information (information about politics that is a byproduct of other activities) at work, normally because their work often interacts with the government. Education is a good place to start with, but it will not solve the problem of political information. What is needed are institutions that disseminate what Downs calls 'free information' to ordinary people. Many working class people have had this kind of free information to some extent through unions, especially in the third quarter of the twentieth century. But in the US, the UK and France, unions have been losing a great deal of ground, which may be why right-wing nationalists have gained more ground in these societies than in northern European societies. The point here is not that there is an easy fix but rather that there are things that have been done and can be done to improve the information of less affluent people, and their interests are genuinely at stake in this.

Brennan employs another argument that briefly shows up at different points in his discussion without receiving much critical attention. This is the argument that political power involves having an impact on other people while economic activities are primarily self-regarding. So even if people are ignorant in economic life as much as they are in political life, economic ignorance only affects the person who is ignorant (p. 238). But this is profoundly implausible. External effects of action are ubiquitous in economic life even though they are not very much in evidence in the a priori world of the early chapters of a book on "basic economics". Furthermore, since economic interaction takes place entirely in imperfect markets, asymmetries of information and inequalities of bargaining power give some people the power to determine much more of the content of the agreements they enter into than others. And the cumulative effects of many other people's actions in a market on my well-being is enormous. If they act stupidly or corruptly, as in the last economic crisis, this has a great impact on everyone's lives. I suppose the leaders of the Communist Party in the Soviet Union thought that this was adequate reason to try to have experts run the economic system. But the experience of epistocracy in the case of markets was as bad as the case of epistocracy with regard to public goods.

In sum, Brennan asks a really important question, but he doesn't frame it very well. He relies on a very simple micro-theory to suggest that democracies are not very successful societies and then asks whether epistocracy can do better. The right question is: how is it possible for democracies to work reasonably well, even for the worst off, when they must make use of an extensive division of cognitive labor that requires that the driving power of the system not be very well informed? Perhaps if we can figure out the answer to this question, we can also figure out how to make democracies work better.