Against Equal Opportunity

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Cavanagh, Matt, Against Equal Opportunity, Oxford University Press, 2002, 232pp, $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 0199243433.

Reviewed by Louis Pojman, United States Military Academy


This book would more accurately be titled Against Meritocracy and Equality. It examines three positions regarding fairness in hiring people for jobs: (1) meritocracy: the view that the best-qualified people should be hired for jobs; (2) equality: the view that everyone should have equal life chances; and (3) the combination of these two positions. It does not object to the idea, often associated with equal opportunity, that one ought not to discriminate on the basis of race and sex in hiring. If this were all equal opportunity was about, there would be no problem. Cavanagh wants to draw attention to the vagueness and confusion attached to the term ‘equal opportunity’. He also argues that neither meritocracy, equality, nor the combination of the two can be sustained as sound criteria on the basis of which hiring decisions should be made.

The book is divided into three parts. Part 1 examines meritocracy; Part 2 equality; and Part 3 contains Cavanagh’s own solution to the problem of fairness. His main contentions against meritocracy are that it has more to do with efficiency than fairness and that it neglects the fact that employers ought to have some discretion about whom they hire. Hiring a friend who needs work over a more skilled person is not always immoral. His attack on equality is even more forceful and comprehensive, arguing that all forms of contemporary egalitarianism are mistaken, if not positively incoherent. There is no property that all people have in common and to an equal amount. Other interpretations of equality, such as everyone having an equal starting place and everyone having an equal chance for success are fraught with insurmountable difficulties. He rejects the idea that equality is intrinsically valuable, for it would support the downscaling move to everyone being equally bad off, which is counterintuitive.

In Part 3, Cavanagh brings his discussion to a conclusion. Why is discrimination based on race or sex wrong? “What makes it wrong (when it is wrong) is that it is wrong because it involves treating people with contempt, when that is not deserved.”(25) The implications of this view are that it is not wrong to discriminate either when people do deserve contempt or when the discrimination does not imply contemptuous treatment. His conclusions are (1) that while meritocracy may be rational, it has more to do with efficiency than fairness and it ought not to be imposed on people; (2) that equality isn’t something we should even be pursuing in the area of employment opportunities; and (3) nondiscrimination (regarding race and sex), while something we ought to pursue, should be interpreted more narrowly than it is. Merit and equality are overemphasized by conservatives and liberals respectively.

Cavanaugh’s aim is to “loosen the grip” these ideas have on our thinking, so that other ideas may take their place (35). What are these ideas? Towards the end of the book he limns a brief positive message about equal opportunity. We should commit ourselves to a world where no one is left without hope, where everyone can improve his or her life, or as Cavanagh negatively puts it, we should make sure that “no one is left in a position where there is nothing they can do to change their life for the better.” (26) He suggest that when suitably analyzed our commitment to meritocracy is really a commitment to developing one’s talents and our commitment to equality is really a commitment to ensuring that people are not left without hope in bettering their lives. What really is important is autonomy. People should have some control over their lives.

Let me briefly outline Cavanagh’s two main theses: that merit cannot survive as the criterion of equal opportunity and that equality does not survive analysis as the criterion of equal opportunity. Regarding meritocracy, Cavanagh argues that the major interpretation of merit has to do with hiring the person best qualified to do the job. This may be seen as promoting efficiency, getting the best results at the lowest costs in energy and effort. While efficiency certainly is a salient economic value and rational value, it lacks decisive moral force. That is, no one on the outside has a right to tell the employer whom to hire for a job. If I put a premium on family solidarity, I am permitted to do with my business whatever I like and hire my nephew or brother-in-law even though a more highly qualified person has applied for the job in question. The principle of freedom of association trumps merit. Cavanagh considers allowing preferential treatment on the basis of utilitarian goals. He gives the example of a medical school which admits a certain number of candidates who are less qualified than others but who are likely to serve in poorer communities where medical care is both scarce and needed. He argues that the medical school should be permitted to admit less able applicants who are likely to serve in poor communities. On this reading, admittance cannot be based on racial characteristics (since that is the one form of discrimination that equal opportunity legitimately prohibits), but must be grounded in some reasonable expectation that the applicant will serve in an underprivileged area of society. He also endorses indirect meritocracy, that is, promoting more autonomy and competence though better state education.

If Cavanagh simply wants to show that other values besides efficiency are relevant in making decisions about hiring, he has succeeded. But most political philosophers already knew this. He recognizes, but doesn’t develop, the distinction between private and public institutions in hiring. His arguments about freedom of association are relevant to private businesses, but much less so regarding public ones. In the public domain merit-efficiency and the overall good of the society override freedom of association. The hiring officer has no right to hire his brother-in-law above the best-qualified applicant. In this regard, we can see how Cavanagh’s principle of preferential acceptance to medical school of those more likely to serve poor communities actually fits in with a merit-based practice. We need to distinguish micro-meritocracy from macro-meritocracy. While John as an individual in the relevant applicant pool may make the best physician, Mary, who is dedicated to serving in Appalachia, where doctors are scarce, may actually create the best overall situation. Since medicine is about meeting health needs, we may actually serve the criterion of macro-merit by choosing the slightly less competent, but more humane, Mary over the highly competent, but less humane, John.

In the end, Cavanagh does not achieve his goal of undermining merit, though he may loosen the grip some of us have on some interpretations of that principle. By distinguishing private from public hiring processes and by distinguishing micro- from macro meritocracy, meritocracy survives his critique, not as an absolute, but as a prima facie principle.

With regard to equality, Cavanagh’s argument seems more cogent. He begins by analyzing the claim “that it is unfair for some people to be worse off than others through no fault of their own,” (96) which he attributes to Gerald Cohen, Ronald Dworkin and Tom Nagel. Cavanagh notes that this seems to boil down to a desert-based argument. It is unfair if anyone is worse off than anyone else unless they have done something to deserve it. It’s unfair if they’re worse off if they’ve simply had bad luck. But by parity of reasoning, it must be equally bad for someone to be the recipient of good luck if it is not deserved. If I receive a windfall of a pot of gold, it must be redistributed appropriately to bring everyone else up. But what if I’m struck by lightning, the victim of cancer or mental illness or a premature death? How does one redistribute these evils? How does one fairly compensate the victim? Does the concept of unfairness even apply to these situations? Cavanagh thinks not, and his surrounding discussion is persuasive. Good luck is intrinsically unobjectionable, even if we are justified in confiscating it “to pay for the correction of other people’s bad luck.” (98) There is an intuitive asymmetry between bad and good luck, so that we ought not downscale people’s good luck, but should correct for people’s bad luck in order to give them more control over their lives.

The second version of the egalitarian argument Cavanagh considers is the one that states, “it is unfair to treat some people worse than others for no good reason.”(99f) If this is interpreted as ‘ don’t treat people differently unless you have a good reason to do so’ the thesis becomes a meritocratic one. On the other hand, where resources are scarce, there is good reason for treating them differently. Take the situation where several people are in a hospital waiting to be treated for a disease. We may suppose they are all equally needy and deserving. Still, if there are limited resources, we may be justified in treating the ones whose treatment will cost less for greater benefits. A utilitarian or triage procedure may constitute the sufficient reason for different treatment.

Cavanagh briefly considers a religious argument for equality—that we are all children of God. This might be an adequate basis for a religious person, but it doesn’t give us much guidance, if any, with regard to how we are to treat people or give them opportunities for jobs. In a secular society the metaphor is useless, since there is no “secular analogue” which we could substitute for the religious idea. The idea that we are “equally human” doesn’t satisfy the bill, for we need to know what property in our humanity constitutes the necessary and sufficient condition for equal worth as the basis of equal opportunity. Any property we take, like rationality, is a degree term, which justifies inequalities. (108-11)

Finally, Cavanagh considers the communitarian argument by Richard Norman and others that fraternity is the basis of our equality. In a close-knit group (e.g., a family, an athletic team, or a commune) we often want to share the proceeds of our effort, even if some members have produced more than others. (112-118) The problem is that this model cannot easily be extended from a small group to society at large, let alone humanity at large. Indeed, the standard economic model is one of individual competition, not communal sharing.

Cavanagh ends the book by briefly defending his positive point, that people should be enabled to have some control of their lives, sufficient control to live a satisfying life. In other words, sufficiency of opportunity replaces equality of opportunity. He applies his arguments to contemporary British politics, which uses the rhetoric of equal opportunity quite amorphously.

My overall assessment is that, although it does not completely succeed in its ambitious goal of undermining both meritocracy and equality as criteria for equal opportunity, this is a well-argued, insightful, highly nuanced book, well worth close study by anyone who is concerned to make sense of the concept of equal opportunity. It is a model of close, rigorous, analytic thinking about moral matters. It challenges received orthodoxies at several points, and forces all of us to reevaluate our commitment to meritocracy and equality.