Against Facts

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Arianna Betti, Against Facts, MIT Press, 2015, 296pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262029216.

Reviewed by Maria van der Schaar, Leiden University


It is a fact that Napoleon was defeated at Waterloo and that Hitler lost the war. Against Facts does not claim that these sentences are false. Instead it argues against two influential ways in which philosophers understand the notion of fact. Facts are generally understood as compositional facts, or as whatever is named by 'the fact that so and so.' Arianna Betti argues that, if such expressions are names at all, the best candidates for reference are propositional facts, that is, true propositions, ideal objects on 'the level of sense'. A compositional fact is "a real object (and) part of the world at the level of reference" (p. 23). How does a compositional fact differ from events and from complexes? The fact Caesar's being dead differs from the event Caesar's death insofar as the event does not contain Caesar as a constituent. Facts are complex objects, but not complexes. A complex of Caesar and being dead does not constitute a fact because a complex is merely a collection, a mereological sum, of Caesar and being dead. A fact is a unity, a third thing in the world over and above its constituents, the defenders of compositional facts claim.

The first part of the book argues against compositional facts, the second half against propositional facts, and more generally against the thesis that that-clauses are singular terms. The book is a well argued and well structured defence of the thesis that philosophers are not in need of facts in either the compositional or the propositional sense. The main opponents are David Armstrong, Kit Fine and Wolfgang Künne, as well as those philosophers who rely on linguistic evidence as presented, for example, by Zeno Vendler. Betti makes some interesting claims concerning the use of linguistic evidence in philosophy, and I come back to these methodological points at the end.

Why do philosophers think we need compositional facts? Apparently, we need them because they are able to fulfil semantic roles: for example, being a truthmaker, that in virtue of which a sentence is true. Facts are understood as fulfilling the ontological role of unifying a relation with its terms, supposing that relations in themselves are not enough to relate the terms of a relation. As facts are structured entities, they are able to unify a, love and b in the order of a's loving b. The fact that a loves b is thus not the same as the fact that b loves a. Do we need facts here? From a logical point of view, it does not seem to be so. Just as concepts are one-place (non-linguistic) predicates, relations are predicates with more than one open place. The unity of the relation with its terms is accounted for by the relation itself insofar as it is unsaturated. If the relation is a two-place predicate, there are two slots in the relation, and an ordered pair is needed to fulfil it. We are thus able to account for the difference between a's loving b and b's loving a without needing to acknowledge facts here. Ordered pairs are essentially more than a sum of the elements, as there is a difference between < a, b > and < b, a >. From a logical point of view, we are thus in need of non-mereological sums in order to account for asymmetric relations. Furthermore, we can explain relations as having open places only insofar as we have acknowledged nonmereological wholes, unified complexes consisting of relations and their terms. From these wholes we subtract objects in order to explain that relations and concepts are unsaturated. If these wholes were understood to be mereological, the relation would be as saturated as the object, and no unity would be accounted for.

In chapter three, the author aims to give an answer to the unity problem in terms of a mereological ontology. The notion of relata-specific relations is used to account for the unity problem. As these relata-specific relations together with their relata may also function as truthmakers, facts are not needed for that role either, the author argues. What are relata-specific relations? "If R is relata-specific, and thus it is in the nature of R to relate a and b, then aRb exists as soon as R exists." (p. 92). We have to make here a distinction between the relation R1 relating a and b in such a way that a's loving b comes to exist, and the relation R2 relating a and b in such a way that b's loving a comes to exist. The slots of R1 and R2 must be different, so that R1 will by definition get a in its first slot, and R2 will get b in its first slot (p. 93). In this way we need neither ordered pairs, nor facts, and we can stay within a mereological framework to explain how relations relate their terms. A similar answer can be given to the question what unifies a non-linguistic predicate to its object. This solution makes sense if we consider relations to be tropes, irrepeatable qualities, dependent for their existence on particular individuals. One has to account for the fact that in both cases a loving (R) is involved, and one needs to account for the generality of predication. One could answer that the trope R1 involves the aspect of loving, instantiating the universal loving, and the aspect of a_ X _ b, where a and b merely indicate the relata specific slots (and thus differ from a and b that get into the slots), and that this aspect differs from b_X_a, the corresponding aspect in R2. How are we to explain this difference between R1 and R2 within a mereological framework? And how can we explain what slots are without invoking the notion of a nonmereological whole?

* * *

What are propositions, according to those who defend the thesis that facts are true propositions? Betti proposes two explanations: (1) propositions are non-linguistic objects that function as the meaning of linguistic expressions and their parts have the same ontological nature as propositions themselves. "Propositions so conceived are what is primarily true or false," (p. 31). Not all propositions so conceived are the primary bearers of truth and falsity, for parts of sentences also have meaning, as well as interrogative sentences, optatives and imperatives. 'Go now' does not express a proposition. Propositions are the meanings of declarative sentences, or they are those meanings which are true or false. We thus need an account of what declarative sentences are, or of what truth and falsity is, in order to explain the notion of proposition. Propositions may also be explained as (2) 'syntactico-semantic meaningful unities'. Again, this explanation is in need of the notion of declarative sentence, or of the notions of truth and falsity. Betti's aim, though, is not to give a positive account of propositions, but rather to argue against the acknowledgement of facts as true propositions.

An important argument given by the defenders of propositional facts is a linguistic one. If there are singular terms for facts in natural language, such as 'the fact that p', then facts exist (p. 111), at least, if we can formulate a true sentence, such as 'The fact that the Labour Party has won is a surprise to us all'. Betti argues, under reference to Kevin Mulligan and Fabrice Correia, that that-clauses cannot be understood as singular terms. For example, that-clauses cannot be substituted for the individual variable in x = x: 'That Argle is nice is identical with that Argle is nice' is ungrammatical (p. 140), although 'The fact that Argle is nice is identical with the fact that Argle is nice' is grammatical. Neither is 'the fact that p' a singular term, Betti argues, for it is neither a definite description nor an appositive description, such as 'the king Alexander'. It is not a standard definite description, for there is no general characteristic for the fact that Argle is nice, nor is it an appositive description, as Künne has argued for 'the proposition that . . . ', for these are a combination of a general term ('king', 'proposition') and a singular term ('Alexander') (pp. 149, 150); for, that-clauses are not singular terms, according to Betti. Is it true that that-clauses cannot function as singular terms? Indeed, the example with 'Argle' is a bit awkward, but 'That Quick Silver is now behind the other horses is not the same as that he won't win the race' makes perfect sense and can be formulated as a ≠ b.

Vendler has argued on linguistic grounds for a distinction between facts and propositions. According to Vendler, in 'Tim knows that Onassis married Jacqueline Kennedy' and 'Tom knows that Onassis married the widow of the late President', Tim and Tom are described as knowing the same fact, namely whom Onassis married. Betti argues that if this were the case, the following inference would be valid: Oedipus knew that he married Jocasta. Therefore, Oedipus knew that he married his mother (p. 177). Betti's aim is not to understand the problem but to argue against Vendler on his own terms. This is valuable in itself, but the reader gets involved in the problem and would like some cues for understanding.

According to Betti, " 'is a fact' is not a genuine predicate, applying to the objects falling under 'something' in 'something is a fact' " (p. 151). 'Falling under' has had since Frege a technical meaning: objects fall under a concept; here actual facts fall under the concept fact, while the concept fact falls under the existential quantifier. Therefore, objects do not fall under something. The point that 'is a fact' is not a genuine predicate may mean that there are no objects falling under the concept being a fact, that the concept is empty, or that 'is a fact' should not turn out as a predicate in a regimented logic. What are we to say then of sentences such as 'The victory of the Labour party is a fact' and 'Georgia Evolution Lawsuit Is a fact'? In the first sentence we talk about events, Betti says; in the second, we talk of "decisions, declarations, bills, statements, and lawsuits when describing these as the result of certain processes." (p. 154). This is an interesting idea, but Betti's aim is not to give a positive account of what we mean when we talk of facts. The book is useful in itself for those who defend the thesis that there are facts, for they can consult the book to see whether their position is refuted. And it can be stimulating for those who still defend facts because they will have to come up with a notion of fact that is not refuted (yet) by Betti. There is also an unintended danger, though. Some might say, as there are no facts, there is no fact that six million Jews were killed by the Nazi's. As Betti puts it in the conclusion, facts, as opposed to opinions, fall "in the same category of grounded statements . . . that are held long enough by a large number of people." (p. 226). How does this position prevent relativism, as facts seem now to be linguistic entities? At other places, facts are taken to be the semantic value of certain expressions by stipulation. Betti's answer will be that it is not the aim of the book to give a positive account of these problems, but the reader is eager to know more now that he is engaged in the problem.

Betti does give some positive, interesting ideas on philosophical method. She invokes not a few linguistic arguments to refute those philosophers who themselves invoke arguments based on the use of language and who rely on Vendler as a linguist in their argument for facts. Vendler's linguistic evidence is not philosophically neutral, though. Knowledgeable as she is about linguistics, Betti uses these arguments only insofar as her opponents use them, for she herself considers linguistic arguments to be "bad tools for doing real work in metaphysics." (p. 161). Such a language-based or descriptive metaphysics presupposes the entities it argues for: "There is no hope to pull an ontological rabbit out of a linguistic hat." (p. 229). Her point is that our philosophical arguments should be other than purely linguistic ones. And one cannot but agree. Descriptive metaphysics should be replaced by a revisionary one, Betti claims, and one would like to know more about it. Philosophers, being reasoning agents par excellence, assume in their reasoning a certain logic. It is therefore of crucial importance to understand to what entities one is committed through the use of one's logic. Metaphysics is not a science, discovering what entities there are. It is rather that our logic commits us to a certain metaphysics. Perhaps, this is what Betti understands by a revisionary metaphysics.