Against Individualism: A Confucian Rethinking of the Foundations of Morality, Politics, Family, and Religion

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Henry Rosemont Jr., Against Individualism: A Confucian Rethinking of the Foundations of Morality, Politics, Family, and Religion, Lexington Books, 2015, 190pp., $85.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780739199800.

Reviewed by Li-Hsiang Lisa Rosenlee, University of Hawaii, West Oahu


This book has ten chapters and can be roughly divided into two parts: the first five chapters focus on the discussion of many problematics of the Western notion of individualism; and the second half is devoted to the Confucian role-based alternative. This book can be seen as a culmination of Henry Rosemont Jr.'s decades of work in the field of comparative philosophy. His critique of Western individualism along with his search for Confucian spirituality as an alternative stretches back to his early works such as A Chinese Mirror: Moral Reflections on Political Economy and Society (Open Court, 1991), "Human Rights: A Bill of Worries" (in Confucianism and Human Rights, Columbia University Press, 1998) and Rationality and Religious Experience: The Continuing Relevance of the World's Spiritual Traditions (Open Court 2001). Against Individualism is a natural progression of all these early groundworks that Rosemont has laid along the way.

The Western notion of a free, autonomous, independent individual, an inner self untouched by sociality is, as Rosemont argues, not only an ontological fiction, but more importantly ethically problematic, since to champion one's freedom unencumbered by others as the utmost value for the libertarian and social conservative alike comes at the expense of the advancement of socio-economic justice. (54) For the first generation human rights (i.e. the Bill of Rights) are passive, focusing on freedom from constraints, and for the second generation human rights (i.e. socio-economic rights) are positive rights, requiring assistance from others to provide means to exercise those rights. These two rights stand in opposition if our conception of the self is grounded in foundational individualism. As Rosemont writes precisely,

To whatever extent we may be seen to be morally and thus politically responsible for assisting others in the creation and obtaining of those goods which accrue to them by virtue of having social and economic rights, to just that extent we cannot be altogether autonomous individuals, enjoying full civil and political rights, free to rationally decide upon and pursue our own projects rather than having to assist the less fortunate with theirs. (66)

And if so, the notion of Western individualism not only does not help alleviate poverty and social inequality; it in fact aggravates it, since the well-to-do and the needy alike are conceptualized as responsible only to oneself and hence only for oneself as well. Each rises and falls on one's own, and to exercise the second generation rights would be impossible within the framework of individualism. A conceptual alternative obviously is sorely needed if we are to address the many socio-economic problems threatening the global community today.

Despite all its problems, the lures of individualism, as Rosemont concedes in the "Epilogue," remain strong in the West, since the myth of a free, autonomous and independent self is intertwined with our self-representation and undergirds capitalism (177). It is a myth that is so ingrained in our psyche since the Enlightenment that any proposed alternative immediately is characterized as its direct opposite, that is, collectivism or totalitarianism. It is as if the choice is a Kierkegaardian either/or: either one champions individualism all the way down or one is for the collectivism of a hive mind. Western individualism might have worked in the past in helping establishing individual rights and limited state authority; the problems that we face today demand a different kind of response, a response that is not modeled after the Us vs. Them or absolute individual liberty vs. tyrannical government. The Confucian relational approach is a perfect medium to rebuild the lost interpersonal relationships that are needed for a more cohesive and a more perfect union in this global world. It is a vision of the co-emergence of the self and the other in relation, a kind of self-identity that doesn't hedge on some sort of immutable inner self, but instead an existential self that becomes increasing concrete with the ever expanding social roles that one lives throughout one's lifetime.

The most important role that is demanded of us in the Confucian tradition is the role of son and daughter along with its corresponding excellence of xiao (filial reverence). But in this day and age, to revive the concept of Confucian xiao might seem old fashion and, some might even argue, oppressive to those who occupy the role of children. That familial constraint runs counter to the Western myth of a free, autonomous, independent self who cares for no one and for whom no one cares. The Hobbesian adult male sprung out of nowhere like a wild mushroom has been the standard, default vision of the self in the Western discourse on ethics and politics. As Rosemont points out, most modern western philosophers are bachelors and have no experience of family life beyond their childhood, philosophers such as Descartes, Leibniz, Spinoza, Locke, Berkeley, Hume, Kant, Nietzsche, and Schopenhauer (119). It is no surprise to see not only a deficit on the topic of family and parent-child relation in the West, but also a skeptical attitude toward the ethical valence of Confucian xiao. In fact, Confucian xiao has been and is continued to be defined as ethically problematic (cf. Bertrand Russell 1922; Walter Slote 1998; Donald Holzman 1998; Ranjoo Seodu Herr 2003; Liu Qingping 2007). But the critique of Confucian xiao need not stand, since a careful reading of the Western canonical writings on family and parent-child relation reveals a much more oppressive family structure and relation that has been largely neglected by contemporary scholars.

For instance, in Jeffrey Blustein's (1982) comprehensive survey, the family structure and parent-child relation in the Western canonical writings often times is modeled after the contractual master-servant relationship where the head of the household has all the authority and the children all the obedience. Although thinkers such as Seneca, Locke, and Kant have also pointed out some parental obligations such as education, protection and financial support, the fundamental aspect of parent-child relation is one of domination and submission. Nowhere in any of the writings discussed in Blustein's comprehensive survey (1982) is it mentioned or even hinted that children have the right or obligation to remonstrate the parents. The familial bond in the western canons is more of a contractual nature than a life-long affective bond that generates the special familial obligation. Kant, in particular, notes that grown children owe their parents nothing other than the general duty of gratitude, which is connected to the love for humanity, not a special obligation that ties the child to the parent in this life and beyond (Metaphysics of Morals, "Doctrine of Right" Ch. 28-30; "Doctrine of Virtue", Ch. 31-32; cf. Mary Gregor 1996). In comparison, the parent-child relation in Confucianism is one of affection and mutual obligation. Familial bond is not something to be discharged upon entering adulthood; in addition, Confucian emphasis on the obligation of remonstration to the social superior including one's parents is quite refreshing, or one might even say it is a step forward ethically.

In Confucianism, relationality is the basis of our ontological existence throughout our lifetime; there is no sharp divide between the contractual dependency of childhood and the absolute freedom and equality of adulthood. Unlike in the West, as Rosemont writes, "for the Confucians there are only interrelated persons, no individual selves" (93). And if relationality is the ontological starting point of our existence, then to think of a Confucian relational person as either being self-less or altruistic in living their social roles is to miss the mark, since to live those roles is to bring forth their existential personhood that only exists in relations. In short, to be for the Confucians is to be one-in-relation-with-the-other; one is only when the other is as well. Or what is the same, as Confucius says, when seeking to establish oneself, one establishes others (Analects 6.3; c.f. Ames and Rosemont 1998). When one's personhood is thus conceived, the natural antagonism between self and other assumed by modern Western thinkers such as Hobbes and Kant--whose writings are the basis for political rights of the individuals that has led to the excess of individualism at the expense of the second generation rights in our time--is also overcome as well.

Confucian interpersonal personhood indeed provides a viable way forward to incorporate second generation rights into our modern state and civic life. For in Confucianism, as Rosemont points out, freedom is seen "as an achievement term, not a stative one, such that we can only begin to think of becoming truly free when we want to meet our responsibilities, when we want to help others . . . , and enjoy being helped by others" (106-7). This intentional cultivation to take joy in meeting one's inter-personal responsibilities, to have others flourish, to Rosemont, is a "spiritual practice, Confucian style" (107). It is a spiritual practice that takes the family as the starting point in preparation for full membership in our shared humanity (108). Confucian xiao that brings forth our respect for those who came before and from whom our being emerges "can be seen most vividly, most religiously and most importantly, as a strategy for strengthening the roles of and bonds between those still alive, adding significance to their lives" (132). In other words, through our respect for our common root that the living are bound together and our lives made significant. This root of commonality need not be limited to one's family, ethnicity or culture; rather it is the root of common humanity, as Confucius puts it, within four seas all are one's brothers (Analects 12.5). It is a spiritual vision of the world that is made ever more harmonious through the affirmation of the intertwining of oneself and others in our shared humanity.

A religious impulse, as Rosemont terms it, is a "homoversal", a shared human attitude and behavior that conveys a sense of "being in the presence of something larger than themselves, something that was present before we came to be, something of which we can be a part now, and which will endure long after we are gone" (137). In Confucianism, religious sensibility is expressed through the medium of ritual, which is religious and secular at the same time, covering not only significant ceremonies but also all our social interactions; or rather, it is the secular made sacred through one's embodiment of rituals (141-42). Rituals with the obvious religious root, in Confucianism, also have an aesthetic as well as an ethical dimension. As Xunzi explains perfectly, "Rites trim what is too long and stretch out what is too short, eliminate surplus and repair deficiency, extend the forms of love and reverence, and step by step bring to fulfillment the beauties of proper conduct" (Xunzi, Ch. 19; cf. Watson 1969, 100 and Rosemont 143). Taking rituals and traditions seriously as important aspects of a flourishing life, as Rosemont concludes, would serve us well to go beyond the narrowness of individualism as well as its temporality (146). For by embodying the rituals, one comes to acknowledge the co-humanity of our fellows both living and dead, with sincerity and grace, and with due measure and beauty. Indeed, rituals give Confucian personhood a sense of enduring continuity connecting the present self to the ancestral past as well as to the future generation that is yet to come. And that shared sense of common humanity in turn propels the Confucians to go beyond their immediate circles of family and friends into the world at large.

A role-bearing Confucian, as Rosemont argues, is much more equipped to deal with the problem of socio-economic injustice, since unlike other major religions, Confucian spiritual development is intrinsically connected to one's moral life in the communal setting. Given the fact that there is no monastery in the Confucian tradition, "without others, Confucian spiritual cultivation is not possible" (163). Interestingly, George Rupp, a former dean of Harvard Divinity School, although not a sinologist, reaches the same conclusion in his assessment of world religions: "For the Confucian, there is no access to the ultimate except through social relationships" (2015, 77). In other words, a Confucian spiritual life is a social life made sacred, and the wider the web of social relations one sustains, the more significant one's spiritual life has become.

The Confucian spiritual drive to extend, sustain and repair relationships can also be applied to deal with the trauma of criminal violations. For reconciliation is much more appealing to role-bearing Confucians than vengeance, and in order to truly overcome trauma and heal severed relationships, we must go beyond the current legal system of impersonal guilt and punishment that doesn't restore the victim or rehabilitate the wrongdoer. Rosemont offers a Confucian inspired reading of the religious concepts of confession, repentance, atonement, forgiveness and redemption as a better and more comprehensive way to deal with social/political trauma. For, as Rosemont argues,

just as second generation human rights encompass first generation rights much more naturally than the other way around, so too, I believe, is the restorative justice attendant on reconciliation broader than legal justice, yet requires it, while legal justice is narrower than reconciliation, and does not require it (170).

In other words, in reconciliation, both the victim and wrongdoer are made better off, since their personhood is each restored in their mutual acknowledgement through atonement and forgiveness. Although reconciliation might not always be possible, it is a spiritual ideal we should all strive for and is in line with the Confucian ideal of an inclusive, harmonious community of datong where all are cared for.

So if we are serious about going beyond the assumed natural antagonism between the self and other in order to attend to the ever-widening problem of socio-economic injustice and to fashion a much more inclusive global community that is not premised based on the ontologically and ethically problematic Western individualism, we are better off taking the Confucian alterative where I and other are co-emergent relational beings, where to extend, sustain and repair one's social life is a spiritual quest, and where our shared sense of common humanity reaches out to all four seas. Or as Rosemont boldly declares, we must take a stance Against Individualism and walk the path of a Confucian role-bearing person in her spiritual quest of an ever more inclusive and just global community.


Ames, Roger and Henry Rosemont. Trans. 1998. The Analects of Confucius: A Philosophical Translation. Ballantine Books.

Blustein, Jeffrey. 1982. Parents and Children: The Ethics of the Family. Oxford University Press.

Gregor, Mary. Trans. 1996. Kant: The Metaphysics of Morals. Cambridge University Press.

Herr, Ranjoo Seodu. 2003. "Is Confucianism Compatible with Care Ethics? A Critique." Philosophy East and West 53.4 (Oct.): 471-489.

Holzman, Donald. 1998. "The Place of Filial Piety in Ancient China." Journal of The American Oriental Society 118.2 (April-June):185-199.

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Rupp, George. 2015. Beyond Individualism: The Challenge of Inclusive Communities. Columbia University Press.

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