In this book Marc Alspector-Kelly addresses many central issues in epistemology, giving special attention to skepticism, but his main concern is to deny skeptics one of their favorite tools by arguing against the knowledge closure principle, which says roughly that “any agent who knows P and recognizes that P implies Q knows—or is in a position to know—Q” (1).
Alspector-Kelly begins by clarifying the principle he means to reject. His target is single-premise closure of knowledge under deductive inference, wherein some subject S recognizes that a single conclusion Q follows deductively from a single premise P, where “recognizing that P implies Q” is being “inherently disposed to believe Q if one believes P, and not-P if one believes not-Q” (10).
Further clarification of the principle is complicated by the question of what warrants things that are implied by warranted beliefs, and the question of when warrant is transmitted from one to the other. Let’s say that warrant is whatever it is that makes the difference between true belief and knowledge, that a belief is warranted when based on such a warrant, and that knowledge is transmitted in cases where knowledge of Q is acquired due to S’s recognition that P implies Q. If S knows P and recognizes that P implies Q, perhaps S will always end up being in a position to know Q even though knowledge is not always transmitted—even though S does not acquire a warrant due to S’s knowing P and recognizing that P implies Q. To allow for the possibility that knowledge is not always transmitted, yet S does always end up being in a position to know Q upon knowing P and recognizing that P implies Q, Alspector-Kelly formulates closure in terms of warrant, as follows:
Warrant Closure: Necessarily, for every agent S and propositions P and Q: if (a) S’s belief that P is warranted while (b) S recognizes that Q follows from P, then (c) S has a warrant for Q. (13)
Isn’t some version of the closure principle obviously true, as many epistemologists have suggested? It might seem so, since, as Alspector-Kelly acknowledges, “deductive inference is an excellent way to extend one’s knowledge” (3). However, he thinks there are exceptions to closure. To support this claim, he sets out several putative counterexamples, and considers various strategies for showing that these do not really impugn closure.
The counterexamples include cases that Fred Drestske described in his essays, such as the one Alspector-Kelly calls Zebra. In Zebra, some subject S is in an ordinary zoo, looking in a cage containing just one animal, a zebra, and, because it looks like a zebra, S believes the proposition that the animal in the cage is a zebra. S recognizes that from this proposition it follows that the animal in the cage is not a mule that is cleverly disguised to look just like a zebra, and S believes the latter as well. According to Dretske, S knows the animal is a zebra, but not that the animal is not a disguised mule. What, after all, would the warrant be for S’s belief that the animal is not a disguised mule? Presumably not the distinctive zebra appearances that are the basis of S’s belief that the animal is a zebra (Alspector-Kelly is aware that this characterization of the basis of S’s belief is controversial), since a cleverly disguised mule would look the same (at least one painted by Hans L. Bonnevier would), and, as Alspector-Kelly adds, “even if S recognizes that its not being a disguised mule follows from its being a zebra, it seems silly to suggest that she could acquire a warrant for its not being a disguised mule on that basis” (19). S is warranted in believing the animal is a zebra, but not in believing it is not a disguised mule. So warrant, it seems, is not transmitted—it is possible to lack warrant for a belief Q that, we recognize, is implied by our warranted belief P—and closure fails.
I mentioned that Alspector-Kelly anticipates that closure advocates can offer a variety of responses to his argument by counterexample. These strategies include denying that S is warranted in believing P (for example, in Zebra, P is the proposition that the animal is a zebra), insisting that transmission does succeed from P to Q, suggesting that S’s warrant for P also suffices as a direct warrant for Q, claiming that S’s background information delivers a direct warrant for Q, and suggesting that S has a default warrant for Q. Of these, Alspector-Kelly considers the fourth to be the most plausible, but he thinks all of them fail, so the counterexamples to closure are genuine.
Let me make brief remarks about his take on the first three replies by closure advocates. As I mentioned earlier, the first is to claim that the proposition that initially seems warranted, P, and that implies a second proposition, Q, that seems unwarranted, is not really warranted after all. For example, in Zebra, S’s belief that the animal is a zebra is not really warranted. Hence the cases do not threaten closure. However, Alspector-Kelly thinks that those who pursue this strategy will find it difficult to resist skepticism, and I expect he is right. If the price of salvaging closure is accepting skepticism, is closure worth the cost?
The second strategy for handling Alspector-Kelly’s argument by counterexample may be more promising. One might claim that transmission succeeds in Zebra and in like cases—that S does indeed acquire a warrant for the proposition that the animal is not a disguised mule on the basis of recognizing that this follows from its being a zebra. In response to this strategy, Alspector-Kelly draws attention to methods for determining whether P is true or false, as opposed to methods for determining that P is true (he appears to equate these), and notes that some such methods will inevitably return a verdict that P is false whenever P is true. As applied to P, they always deliver false negatives. He claims that no such method can warrant the claim that P is false. He calls this the No Inevitable False Negatives principle. Now, in Zebra, he says, S has a method of evaluating whether the animal is a disguised mule. He does so by identifying its species on the basis of its appearance and then working out what that implies about whether it is a disguised mule. If S decides whether the animal is a disguised mule using this method, it would always return the verdict that it is not a disguised mule in cases in which it is a disguised mule. The verdict whenever S is confronted with a disguised mule will always be a false negative. So S’s method violates the No Inevitable False Negatives principle, and S’s belief that it is not a disguised mule lacks warrant. (Not only does he endorse the No Inevitable False Negatives principle, he also says [62n8] that no method can warrant the claim that P is true if it inevitably returns a verdict that P is true when false; in Zebra, as applied to the proposition that the animal is not a disguised mule, S’s method will say it is true whenever it is false.) Alspector-Kelly concludes that transmission fails.
The third response to Alspector-Kelly’s counterexample argument is to say that whenever S’s belief P is warranted the warrant for P is also a warrant for anything that follows from P. Applied to Zebra, this view says that what warrants S’s belief that the animal is a zebra also gives S a warrant for the proposition that it is not a disguised mule, so that S will be warranted in believing it is not a disguised mule if the basis for this belief is the same as the basis for the belief that the animal is a zebra. Alspector-Kelly suggests that this response is implausible because it seems counterintuitive to say that looking like a zebra warrants the claim that the animal is not a disguised mule and because it endorses “the highly implausible closure principle that S invariably has a warrant for every proposition following from a proposition she is warranted in believing, even if she has absolutely no clue that the one follows from the other” (115). However, as Alspector-Kelly is aware, whether that principle (or any other knowledge closure principle) is true hinges ultimately upon what knowledge is (what counts as warrant depends on what knowledge is), and a safety theorist might well say that if something is a warrant for P, it is a warrant for anything that follows from P, as the latter must be true if the former is. A safety theorist might also say that coming to recognize that Q follows from S’s warranted belief P will reveal to S that S has a warrant for believing Q. In Zebra, in S’s circumstances, if the animal looked like a zebra it would be one, and it would not be a disguised mule. Alter the Zebra case so that the zoo S is visiting has mules disguised as Zebras in it, and S won’t have a warrant for believing that the animal she is examining is not a disguised mule, but by the same token S won’t have a warrant for believing it is a zebra either (even though it is a zebra).
Still, nothing like the third response will work if Alspector-Kelly’s appeal to the No Inevitable False Negatives principle succeeds. But perhaps that principle can be challenged. Safety theorists will reject it, but I expect that Alspector-Kelly hopes his principle will add a layer to the dialectic impasse between safety theorists and sensitivity theorists, tipping the balance towards the latter.
I have mentioned only a handful of Alspector-Kelly’s arguments, but I hope to have given some idea of the riches on offer. Alspector-Kelly greatly illuminates the problem of skepticism, he offers significant challenges to those who take knowledge closure for granted, and in the course of questioning closure he clarifies it, pushing forward the discussion of this central topic in epistemology. This is a splendid book—resourceful, closely argued, and engrossing. Any serious student of epistemology will want to study it.