Against Marriage: An Egalitarian Defence of the Marriage-Free State

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Clare Chambers, Against Marriage: An Egalitarian Defence of the Marriage-Free State, Oxford University Press, 2017, 226 pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198744009.

Reviewed by Shelley M. Park, University of Central Florida


Clare Chambers provides a clear, lucid and timely argument against state-recognized marriage based on the liberal principles of liberty and equality. Canvassing a broad range of philosophical literature on marriage, she argues persuasively that state-sponsored "marriage regimes" violate core principles of liberalism including value neutrality and non-discrimination, and should be replaced with piecemeal regulations of relationships that protect vulnerable parties from injustice without privileging particular relationship statuses.

The book has two parts, each with three chapters. In Part I, Chambers offers her critique of marriage as a state-sponsored institution conferring a package of rights and responsibilities on all and only those who are legally recognized as married. Chapter 1 argues that marriage regimes violate liberalism's commitment to equality by, at best, ignoring and, at worst, perpetuating the sexist and heterosexist foundations of marriage. Chambers also argues here that civil unions (or other "reformed" versions of marriage) "enact inequality between those who have and those who lack the relevant status" (4). Chapter 2 argues that marriage regimes violate liberty by promoting a particular conception of the good without sufficiently weighty public reasons for doing so. Chapter 3 considers several putative liberal justifications for state-recognized marriage including arguments based on improved communications, gender equality, caregiving, child protection, and social stability. In each case, Chambers contends, the arguments fail to show that state-sponsored marriage is both a necessary and an acceptable means of achieving the public good in question.

In Part II, Chambers unpacks her positive vision for a marriage-free state, distinguishing it from alternatives to marriage that have been suggested by other critics of traditional state-sponsored marriage. Chapter 4 considers and rejects "contract regimes" as a replacement for marriage regimes, arguing that relationship contracts can undermine liberty and are difficult to enforce. Chapter 5 distinguishes Chambers' own approach to the marriage-free state from the approach of other feminist critics of marriage. Here she argues that caring relationships should be regulated (1) in a piecemeal rather than holistic fashion; (2) with a focus on relationship practices rather than status; and (3) with the freedom to opt out of default regulations rather than the necessity of opting in. Chapter 6 distinguishes the marriage-free state from the marriage-free society and considers the circumstances under which the state might be justified in intervening in private marriages. Here Chambers clearly distinguishes her own position from a libertarian one by focusing on the state's role in preventing harm to vulnerable populations and to ensuring discriminatory practices are prohibited in the private sector.

Chambers opens with the claim that her book is "for everyone, regardless of marital status" (1). Indeed, one of its strengths is that she keeps squarely in her vision throughout all five groups listed at the outset: "the happily married," "the happily unmarried," the "unhappily unmarried," "the unhappily married," and "children, whose social wellbeing should not depend on their parents' marital status" (1). While arguing against state-recognized marriage, Chambers acknowledges the importance of religious and secular marriage ceremonies and practices to some -- perhaps many -- couples, both straight and gay. Rather than critiquing or devaluing the desire to be married (as some marriage critics do), she accepts this desire as legitimate and seeks to accommodate marriage as one among a variety of forms of private life that the state permits. To permit marriage is not to endorse it, however. The freedom to marry, Chambers argues, must co-exist with the freedom to unmarry or to live a happily unmarried life. A politically neutral (liberal) state will make room for all "reasonable conceptions of the good" (55) without granting "special approbation and symbolic significance to marriage that it denies to other relationships" (63).

As this suggests, and as Chambers also announces at the outset, "this book is not for everyone regardless of political conviction" (1). Her argument is driven by a commitment to egalitarianism arising from the feminist belief that "society is deeply gendered, in a way that harms women, and this is wrong" (2). The book opens thus with a rehearsal of historical and contemporary feminist arguments against marriage as a patriarchal institution oppressive to women (Chapter 1) and concludes with feminist concerns about the oppression of women within private religious marriages (Chapter 6). The latter chapter balances the need to protect women's (and children's) rights with the need to protect religious freedom, deftly arguing that religious freedom cannot include the right of religious leaders to discriminate against members of their own religion. Revealing the sleight of hand that equates religious freedom with the freedom of religious leaders (typically straight men), Chambers argues:

Standard defences of religious exemptions often gloss over this fact and write as if the only interests at stake are those of outsiders, who are potentially harmed . . . and insiders, who are benefited by the exemption [from equality legislation]. . . . But . . . insiders . . . are harmed because they are not treated equally with respect to whatever matter is at hand: access to a religious marriage or divorce, employment as a priest, and so on. . . . They are also harmed by the denial of their religious freedom. (180)

Furthermore, religious exemptions from anti-discrimination legislation cannot be upheld by reference to freedom of association, Chambers argues. When women are excluded from the priesthood and lesbian and gay Catholics are excluded from the rites of marriage, their freedom of association is impeded. They become outsiders, "people who must be excluded for the comfort and bonds of others" (180). Unlike private clubs, where adults who join are aware of the group's commitments, Chambers reminds us, most women, gays, and lesbians have been "pre-consensual" members of their religious community from childhood; thus, they are insiders to a community that actively and unjustly harms them by excluding them on the basis of their membership in a protected group (183).

I have dwelt here briefly on just one of the arguments Chambers makes in defence of state regulation of private marriage because it illustrates her modus operandi. Throughout, she is masterful at anticipating and responding carefully to potential objections to her arguments and proposals. Her anticipation of objections demonstrates a familiarity with a wide swath of literature from and conversations with both feminist and non-feminist scholars of marriage and family, both critics and advocates of marriage, and representatives of a range of liberal (and some illiberal) theoretical approaches. And her responses to those who might disagree with her proposals reveal a two-fold carefulness: as a philosopher, she is thoughtful, deliberate, precise, and meticulous; as a feminist, she is attentive, concerned, and compassionate -- considering not only the philosophical justifications for her proposals but also their practical fall out for women and other vulnerable populations.

This two-fold care informs Chambers' central proposal for the abolition of state-recognized marriage and its replacement with a series of piecemeal regulations governing various relationship practices. Arguing that "bundling caring activity into one privileged status does not capture the complexity and diversity of real lives" (146), she argues for piecemeal regulation of "relationship practices . . . such as property ownership, financial interdependence, emotional interdependence, care, parenting, cohabitation, next-of-kinship, and sexual intimacy" (147). I am highly sympathetic to Chambers' argument against "bundling" different relational practices, which is a core part of her argument against marriage and other status regimes. As feminists, queers, people of color, migrants and others have argued, kinship practices and other practices of care vary widely and may often involve creative solutions in non-ideal circumstances. According rights and responsibilities to all and only those relationships wherein economic, affective, domestic, sexual and reproductive care are intertwined (bundled) erases a vast array of other relationship practices, leaving those who may be most in need of support without state protection. Concern for the vulnerable thus requires careful delineation of diverse practices of care.

Piecemeal regulation of relationship practices may not, however, be as easy as Chambers sometimes suggests. Will the "piecemeal practice based approach" achieve its desired egalitarian ends without intruding on people's privacy? Chambers suggests that:

The state does not need to know a great range of details about people's private lives so as to determine whether they meet the criteria of being in A Relationship. It simply needs to know whether some particular relationship practice applies. In some cases this will be a matter of objective fact: are the people parents? Or, are they both names on the deeds of a property? Or, does one have caring responsibilities for the other? (155)

As a queer, divorced, recoupled but happily unmarried, adult who has mothered two daughters -- one adopted, one biological -- within a large complicated family, and as one of several maternal grandmothers to a child who lives with her paternal great grandmother, I frequently find the questions "who is a parent?" and "who has caring responsibilities?" vexing. Given Chambers' usual care and precision, I was thus startled to see her treat complex questions of parental status and caregiving responsibilities as easily answerable factual questions akin to determining whose name is on a property deed. Chambers observes -- and I agree -- that liberal states typically have procedures in place for determining the answers to these question, so as to "allocate welfare payments, to rule on the custody of children," and so forth (155). However, where family configurations and methods of reproduction are complex, decision procedures may fall short of delivering definitive (much less "objective") answers. Moreover, even where existing state procedures deliver a definitive answer, we cannot assume that those procedures or results are thereby just. Indeed, the primary argument of Against Marriage (with which I agree) is that procedures for allocating rights and responsibilities in state-sponsored marriage regimes are fundamentally unjust -- both to many who are married and to many who are not.

Chambers has a much deeper familiarity with liberal feminism than she does with queer theory and activism. I mention this not to criticize her work but to contextualize her arguments and conclusions. To be sure, she references critical work by Judith Butler, Jack Halberstam, Cheshire Calhoun, and Katherine Franke in Chapter 1's discussion of marriage as heterosexist, acknowledges polygamy and other non-normative sexualities as examples of "reasonable conceptions of the good . . . incompatible with state recognition of [traditional] marriage" in Chapter 2 (55) and aptly characterizes conservative concerns about the "slippery slope" from same-sex marriage to incest and forced marriage as a "moral panic" (172), indicating some familiarity with queer critique.

At the same time, Chambers' arguments against marriage rarely query the importance of "committed and stable relationships" -- especially for the purposes of childrearing (100). In contrast, more radical queer critiques of marriage (including same-sex marriage) as "domestinormative" and "homonormative" situate marriage as part of a larger problem, namely the domestication of queer forms of life through surveillance and regulation. Chambers is either unfamiliar with these critiques or unpersuaded by them -- I suspect the former, since she does not anticipate and respond to these objections to her proposals as she so perspicuously does with other objections. Whichever is true, her inattentiveness to queer relationships might help to explain why Chambers underestimates the difficulties in knowing whether or not particular relationship practices apply. The liberal state is unlikely to have decision procedures in place for identifying non-normative kinship practices (including communal and serial parenting and intergenerational networks of caregiving not modeled on parent-child relationships at all). But these difficulties -- and the potential intrusiveness of determining whether a particular relationship practice applies -- will be most readily visible from the perspective of marginalized populations whose relationship practices are illegible through a liberal lens.

Chambers is more hopeful than I that the central tension in liberalism -- namely the pulling in opposite directions of principles of liberty and equality -- can be resolved. While I am persuaded by her argument that protecting women's (and children's) rights is compatible with religious freedom, properly understood, I am less convinced that protecting women's (and children's) rights through regulating relationship practices is compatible with queer sexual and relational freedoms. Indeed, a long history of criminalizing non-normative sexualities in the name of protecting women -- and especially children -- supports queer suspicion of the regulatory state.

These queer concerns aside, I highly recommend Chambers' book as an important scholarly and pedagogical resource. It is beautifully crafted and makes an important contribution to the literature in liberal political theory and, more specifically, to the philosophical literature on marriage and family. Chambers' arguments against state-sponsored marriage are clear, persuasive, thorough and timely, as are her critiques of the most oft-supported alternatives, namely marital contracts and civil unions. Her discussions of recent feminist literature on marriage clearly delineate the differences among theorists and between their positions and her own. Finally, she models respect for her philosophical interlocutors through fair treatment of their positions and demonstrates respect for her readers through carefully crafted prose, clearly laid out arguments, and frequent summaries and reminders linking sections and chapters together. It was my distinct pleasure to read this book and be provoked by its arguments into a better understanding of both liberalism's promise and its limitations with regard to its support of diverse forms of relationship.