Against Moral Responsibility

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Bruce N. Waller, Against Moral Responsibility, MIT Press, 2011, 352pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262016599.

Reviewed by Saul Smilansky, University of Haifa


Bruce Waller's 1990 book, Freedom without Responsibility, has been one of the most unjustly neglected books of the free will debate. In that book, Waller presented the first systematic contemporary defense of hard determinism, offering both a broadly hard determinist position on the traditional questions of the free will problem, and a pioneering defense of the view that hard determinism is "safe", so that we have little to fear (and indeed much to gain), in practice, from abolishing the belief in moral responsibility. I was thus particularly glad to see the present, much longer book, in which he considerably updates and strengthens the defense of his view.

Waller's major contribution to the free will debate is his radical proposal that we separate free will from moral responsibility. In our "naturalistic" world (which we can take to be a deterministic world, or at least one devoid of libertarian, transcendental free will, irrespective of the truth of determinism) there is, he claims, room for most significant forms of free will, but none at all for moral responsibility and concomitant notions such as desert, praise and blame. In this Waller departs not only from libertarians and compatibilists but also from the most influential strain of hard determinism, as exemplified by Derk Pereboom, which keeps free will glued to moral responsibility -- but denies them both, together. As Waller puts it:

Just deserts and moral responsibility require a godlike power -- the existential power of choosing ourselves, the godlike power of making ourselves from scratch, the divine capacity to be an uncaused cause -- that we do not have. Moral responsibility is an atavistic relic of a belief system we (as naturalists) have rejected, for good reason. Freedom -- and its enhancement -- fits comfortably with our natural world and our scientific understanding of it; moral responsibility does not (p. 40).

After explicating why he thinks that moral responsibility is impossible, Waller argues that this does not much affect free will, and devotes most of the book to an attempt to refute compatibilist attempts to maintain some form of moral responsibility, as well as to address those (such as myself) who think that a world without the beliefs, reactions and practices related to moral responsibility would be much worse. All this Waller does systematically and fairly, even if rather too polemically for my taste. Particularly useful is his identification and clarification of the distinct compatibilist counter-moves on moral responsibility, against which he then presents interesting arguments. In the process, Waller considers a great deal of the significant literature in the free will debate of the last generation, as well as much relevant and fascinating scientific research, mostly by social psychologists. Waller's moral earnestness is never in doubt and, whatever one's ultimate position on the free will problem, the book stands as an important corrective to the common tendency to forget the biases of our present system of blame and punishment:

Moral responsibility focuses attention on the immediate behavior and tends to ignore -- and even insists on ignoring -- the casual history or the deeper characteristics of the individual, as well as avoiding consideration of larger systematic causes; as a result, it neglects the most effective ways of improving behavior and shaping character (p. 143).

I will not be able to consider all that is of interest in this rich and suggestive book, and will limit myself to two points. First, at the end of the day, I do not see why we should accept Waller's complete rejection of moral responsibility. He acknowledges some forms of responsibility: "But you have take-charge responsibility for your own life, which is a responsibility you deeply value and enjoy exercising, and you would rather exercise it badly than turn it over to someone else who could run your life better" (p. 108). Hence,

a world devoid of moral responsibility would not lack all individual responsibility; it would leave ample room for take-charge responsibility and increase the likelihood of exercising it well . . . It enables us to exercise effective control, make our own decisions and choices, reflect carefully on what we deeply value, and manage our own lives (p. 278).

However, if most adults most of the time can "manage their own lives", I see no reason why others cannot hold them accountable for their actions, expect them to behave responsibly and, at least sometimes and in some forms, blame and otherwise sanction them when they do not.

Think of an occasion when you go out to dine at a restaurant. Unless drugged or somehow under an unusual influence you can surely control your behavior. But the same would normally apply to others. The baby on the table next to you is having a tantrum; that baby is not yet in possession of mature capacities for self-control and responsible behavior, but surely its parents have such capacities, and they can and ought to take their child outside till it calms down, rather than allow it to make all present miserable. If they do not, they seem liable to be held accountable, and at least to deserve the resentful looks of those present. Similarly, I see little wrong in maintaining a conventional system in which the waiters in a restaurant know that the customers expect them to be adequately responsive to their reasonable wishes, and that if they are not -- without good reason -- then the customers can blame them and even punish them by reducing the tip. There is nothing here which requires some magical self-creating transcendental abilities, rather than the familiar ideas of being considerate toward others, or of meeting mutually advantageous, tacitly or implicitly agreed upon bargains. As Waller himself notes,

Indeed, if we accept the observations of primatologists (de Waal 1982), we must conclude that patterns of reward and punishment (roughly along the lines dictated by moral responsibility) were probably present in our simian ancestors, as they are in our chimpanzee cousins (p. 135).

Just as we can, according to Waller, responsibly "take charge" of our lives, so we can, as a rule, expect most others to do so in their interactions with us.

Clearly what is happening is that Waller is setting the bar for moral responsibility extremely high. This is curious since -- unlike other incompatibilists on moral responsibility -- he himself has set the bar for free will quite low. Of course, under extremes of reward or punishment, such as when people end up serving life sentences in prison for their irresponsible harming of others, then the determinist should see a big moral problem. A social order based upon compatibilist distinctions is arguably the "best game in town", but when its application ends up severely harming people, then even if all compatibilist conditions have been met, some measure of injustice will follow. Since no one can ultimately control the sources of his or her character and motivation, compatibilist notions of freedom and responsibility will be inevitably shallow, and compatibilists denying the unfairness and injustice involved in following their recommended practices will thus be morally complacent. Nevertheless, we can often plausibly -- and more or less morally, given the alternatives -- live with ideas of free will and moral responsibility, in mitigated form, in our daily lives, when interacting with others, whether they are other customers or waiters in restaurants, drivers we encounter on the roads, the babysitters we choose for our children, the doctors who treat us, or the leaders who make decisions which will affect us and the world.

The second topic that I would like to take up concerns the implications of radically changing our beliefs, practices and reactions, as would be required by the abolition of moral responsibility. The points I have just made in defense of a moderate, limited, local compatibilism (which nevertheless does not deny the partial insights of hard determinism on the compatibility question) will also be relevant here. Everywhere in daily life we have to check for and expect responsible behavior. Moreover, we depend upon the beliefs of others that their moral worth and self-respect will reflect the way in which they function, and that they will be held to account, blamed and punished by others, when they show ill will and behave badly. The universal availability, when acting, of the easy thought that (whatever one's efforts and actions) a complete retrospective excuse lies waiting, is surely not a good idea on the social, pragmatic level.

When it comes to the practical implications, I also find other serious faults in Waller's discussion. Much of the impetus for his criticism of moral responsibility comes from the considerable ills of punishment. Few will deny the faults of the present system and the need for reform, both in prisons and in the social conditions that lead many to them; but Waller is much more radical. Yet surely the hard determinist owes us his own detailed account of a morally and practically sound alternative, if the calls for the abolition of the responsibility-focused present system of justice are to be taken seriously. This has not been done (the term "punishment" does not appear in the index).

Nor am I convinced by Waller's discussion of the reactive attitudes. Take resentment first: "Neither Matthew nor Donna is morally responsible, and neither justly deserves reward or punishment, but that fact -- and my recognition of it -- does not preclude reactive feelings of resentment and gratitude" (p. 200). I do not see how Waller has the resources to claim such things: what, for instance, does it mean to say that resentment is not "precluded" when, according to him, no one deserves to be resented? Similarly, why is being the focus of the resentment of others (when we assume that one is not morally responsible in any way for whatever one did to present the temptation of resentment) different than being unjustly punished?

On gratitude, I need to quote Waller at some length:

The possibility and the legitimacy of reactive gratitude among moral responsibility abolitionists becomes even clearer when we consider our gratitude and affection toward dear old Mom . . . My mother loves me dearly . . . Her affectionate and protective attitude toward me is rooted in a profound maternal instinct, which she certainly did not choose nor construct, and thus (though some might not agree) it seems particularly clear to me that Mom is not morally responsible for her deep and genuine affection and care toward her son, but recognizing and believing that does not reduce in any way the deep gratitude I feel for my mother's profound affection and diligent care. Consider one more example. You are deeply distressed, sitting in a corner of the couch feeling desolate. Your dog, who is quite fond of you, comes up . . . Certainly, you do not consider your faithful dog to be morally responsible, but you have no trouble feeling gratitude (p. 201).

Whatever Waller's mother may feel about it, I do not think that many readers will find that this convinces them of Waller's claim, that there is little to worry about concerning the application of hard determinist ideas to our reactive lives.

Waller has presented us with a forceful, rich and interesting book arguing for a highly original position, It combines compatibilism on free will with hard determinism on moral responsibility, coupled with an optimistic discussion of both the possibility for and the outcome of abolishing moral responsibility. I sincerely hope that with this book his views will receive the critical attention they merit.