Against the Current: Selected Philosophical Papers

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Guillermo E. Rosado Haddock, Against the Current: Selected Philosophical Papers, Ontos, 2013, 461pp., $170.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783868381481.

Reviewed by Richard Tieszen, San José State University


This book contains seventeen papers, fourteen of which were previously published. The papers are on topics in the philosophy of logic, philosophy of mathematics, philosophy of language and related issues in epistemology and metaphysics. The book is divided into two parts. The first (chapters 1-10) presents Rosado Haddock's interpretations of the work of Husserl, Frege, and the young Carnap, and a critical essay on Kripke's claim that there are necessary a posteriori and contingent a priori statements. As reflected in the book's title, Rosado Haddock's views often run counter to some of the widely discussed interpretations of these philosophers. A number of the essays in the volume are sharply critical of central figures in the recent secondary literature on Husserl, Frege, and Carnap. The second part of the book, titled "Some Heterodox Analytic Philosophy", consists of seven chapters containing arguments on behalf of platonism in the philosophy of mathematics, a defense of second-order logic, a new account of analyticity, a sketch of a semantics for mathematical statements that is derived from Husserl's distinction between state of affairs (Sachverhalt) and situation of affairs (Sachlage), and a critique of Kripke's possible world semantics for modal logic. Since there is a lot of material here I will indicate briefly some main themes of the essays and conclude with a few questions about several of the claims that are put forward.

The first chapter in the volume, "On the Interpretation of Frege's Philosophy", is markedly polemical in nature. Rosado Haddock argues in this essay and at various other points in the book against interpretations of Frege that see him primarily as a philosopher of language or as a kind of neo-Kantian. He argues that Frege is first and foremost a philosopher of logic and mathematics who is a platonic rationalist. This strikes me as basically the correct view. When it comes to details, philosophers ranging from Sluga, to Currie, Kitcher, Weiner, Reck, Macbeth and Beaney are taken to task, and not with much delicacy. Tappenden's ideas about the Riemannian background of Frege's philosophy come in for special scorn. Rosado Haddock returns to the views of these recent philosophers in some of the other papers in the volume, albeit not as extensively.

Rosado Haddock is anxious in a number of the papers to set the record straight on the relationship of Frege to Husserl, especially in connection with the sense/reference distinction and the critique of psychologism. He argues that Frege and Husserl arrived at the sense/reference distinction independently of one another and he points out that Husserl's refutation of psychologism, once it is in place, is much more sophisticated than Frege's. It is the work in Husserl's Logical Investigations (LI) that takes center stage, when it comes to detail, in most of the essays on Husserl's philosophy of logic and mathematics. Rosado Haddock is of course aware of other published and unpublished work of Husserl on logic and mathematics but it is usually to the LI and writings in a similar vein that he returns when he wishes to defend ideas of Husserl. Chapters 2-8 are devoted mostly to Husserl's work. Chapters 2 and 3 are attempts to inform analytic philosophers (who are generally unfamiliar with Husserl's philosophy) of ideas of Husserl's that should be of interest to them. Chapter 4 is an extensive analysis of the structure of Husserl's "Prolegomena to Pure Logic" and chapter 5 is titled "Husserl's Philosophy of Mathematics: Its Origin and Relevance". Among other things, chapter 5 contains an interesting Appendix devoted to a manuscript of Husserl (to which I shall return below) that bears on the contentious issue of whether, after his transcendental turn, Husserl was or should have been a constructivist in mathematics and logic. Chapter 6 takes up the worthwhile task of comparing Husserl's conception of physical theories and physical geometry at the time of the 'Prolegomena' with the views of Duhem and Poincaré. Chapter 7 is concerned with an analysis of proper names and indexical expressions in the work of Husserl and Frege, finding problems in both accounts.

In chapter 8 Rosado Haddock wishes to offer "a definitive answer to the question of the relation of Husserl's phenomenology to mathematical Platonism and constructivism of the Brouwerian sort." In addition, he wishes to show that Husserl's semantics of sense and reference, by allowing for the interderivability of mathematical statements (such as equivalents of the Axiom of Choice) on the basis of the distinction between states of affairs and situations of affairs, is much more suitable to mathematics than Frege's semantics. This topic is revisited in several other chapters. Some ideas about degrees of extensionality are discussed at the end of the chapter.

Chapter 9, which is directly related to Rosado Haddock's earlier book The Young Carnap's Unknown Master, is one of the most interesting in the collection. Titled "On the Interpretation of the Young Carnap's Philosophy", it offers a Husserlian interpretation of Carnap's dissertation Der Raum and of his book Der logische Aufbau dem Welt, which it contrasts with empiricist-phenomenalist and neo-Kantian renderings and with the recent work of A.W. Carus on Carnap. Rosado Haddock points out that Carnap attended three of Husserl's seminars in 1924-25 while he was writing Der logische Aufbau dem Welt and yet never publicly acknowledged the fact that he attended these seminars. Rosado Haddock says that "it was not emotionally easy for me to show that the young Carnap had obtained many insights from his teacher Husserl and had tried to mask them" (p. 9). This essay is intended to explain in less polemical terms than his book his interpretation of the early Carnap. It is suggested that Carnap's failure to acknowledge similarities between some of his work and Husserl's "put Carnap on the verge of having committed plagiarism" (p. ix).

Chapter 10 contains some reasonable objections to Kripke's claim that there are necessary a posteriori and contingent a priori statements. Chapter 11 discusses six problems and purported solutions to the problems that, it is argued, "have a common source in the general empiricist dogma that permeates basically all Anglo-American analytic philosophy from Russell through Quine to Benacerraf, Field and Maddy". (p. 305) The dogma, it is said, is frequently hidden in appeals to Ockham's razor. Rosado Haddock holds, to the contrary, that logic and mathematics in no way favor empiricism and nominalism but in fact require the existence of abstract entities and a non-empiricist epistemology. The five problems concern first-order versus second-order logic, the so-called Skolem paradox, Benacerraf's ideas about what numbers could not be, Benacerraf's epistemological challenge, and aspects of Quine's challenge to Carnap's definition of analyticity. In Chapter 12 Rosado Haddock argues that Quine's criticism of the notion of analyticity may apply to Carnap's notion but it does not apply to the notions of Frege and Husserl. Some problems with Husserl's notion are, however, indicated and a new (semantic) definition of analyticity is proposed: a statement S is analytic if (i) it is true in at least one structure, and (ii) if it is true in a structure M then it is true in at least any structure M* isomorphic to M. A definition of synthetic a priori statements is also suggested: A statement S is synthetic a priori if (i) it is true in at least one physical world W, and (ii) if it is true in a physical world W then it is true in any other possible physical world W*. Some interesting discussion accompanies these proposals but I do not have space to consider it here.

Chapter 13 is titled "Why and How Platonism". Here Rosado Haddock holds that the best arguments for platonism are those that show the enormous difficulties that permeate all sorts of anti-platonist views. The chapter contains a set of arguments that are directed against anti-platonist views, which are thus taken to be, indirectly, arguments for platonism. Included in the set are Frege's arguments against formalism, some of Gödel's arguments against constructivism and formalism, some arguments from model theory against constructivism and conventionalism, and objections to Quinean-style naturalism, holism and indispensability arguments. One of the arguments in the chapter that appears throughout Rosado Haddock's writings is that non-platonists cannot do justice to the interderivability of seemingly unrelated mathematical statements, such as the Axiom of Choice and the many statements that are equivalent to it. Serious constructivists would, I think, be unmoved by this argument since they already do not accept the parts of mathematics to which the kinds of interderivability results that are cited belong. Interestingly, Rosado Haddock points out that Frege, although a platonist, would also have great difficulties is assessing such interderivabilty results on account of his impoverished semantics, since for Frege the referents of statements are simply truth values. One would need a more sophisticated semantics, such as that suggested by Husserl, in which the referents of statements are states of affairs which are themselves based on situations of affairs.

Chapter 14 returns to the issue of the existence of mathematical entities, the dispute over first- and second-order logic, and the definition of analyticity to suggest how some model-theoretic tools can be used to solve philosophical problems in these areas. Rosado Haddock describes this as a use of logic in rigorous philosophy, a use that runs counter to the prevailing empiricist tradition in analytic circles. The theme is present again in Chapter 15, which focuses on the defense of second-order logic. It offers objections to three arguments against second-order logic; the multiple semantics argument, the model-theoretic argument that first-order logic is the only logic in which both the Compactness Theorem and the Skolem-Löwenheim Theorem are valid, and the Quinean argument. Chapter 16 discusses, somewhat more technically, a semantics that is supposed to do justice to the interderivability phenomenon mentioned above by appealing to states of affairs and situations of affairs, both of which are extensional. Abstract situations of affairs are construed as equivalence classes of states of affairs denoted by closed sentences of a given language which are true in the same models. First-order many-sorted languages and second-order many-sorted languages are both considered. Husserl of course also recognizes that statements can have different senses while referring to the same state of affairs but various intensional aspects of Husserl's theory of meaning and reference are not considered in the semantics. The last paper in the volume, chapter 17, is a short critical discussion of Kripke's views on necessity and existence.

I found it a pleasure to read the essays in this collection. They are clearly written, thought-provoking, and cover an interesting range of topics. Rosado Haddock will probably strike most readers of these essays as an analytic philosopher who, unlike most analytic philosophers even now, knows a lot about Husserl's important views on logic and mathematics. He is also, unlike most analytic philosophers, a platonist about logic and mathematics who deplores efforts to 'naturalize' these subjects. So this is refreshing, and constitutes a good reason to study Rosado Haddock's work.

Regarding Husserl in particular, readers will find very little in the volume on Husserl's views on consciousness, subjectivity, or intentionality. This is not necessarily a problem but just a fact that should be kept in mind. The focus is on objectivity, on the objectivity of logic and mathematics in particular, and not on structures of subjectivity or on the relationship of subjectivity to objectivity that occupies Husserl in much of his more distinctively phenomenological writing, especially in his writing following his transcendental turn. In Husserl's terms, one might say that the emphasis is on objective formal logic, not 'transcendental logic'. Rosado Haddock's treatment of the transcendental turn might in fact raise several questions. On page 175 he tells us that it is Carnap (in the Aufbau) who provided a good assessment of Husserl's transcendental phenomenological turn, namely, that it is a methodological and not a substantial procedure. On page 178 he says that

Husserl's views on mathematics remained the same after the transcendental turn. Although this is difficult to swallow by traditional phenomenologists, it represents no problem for those like the present author, who coincide with Carnap in seeing the phenomenological reduction as a purely methodological device. Thus, Platonism survives the transcendental turn. (See also pp. 240-241)

Several issues are intertwined in this quote but it would be very helpful to know in more detail what is and is not meant when it is said that the phenomenological reduction is a purely methodological device. To what extent, for example, should we be thinking of Carnap here? In the Aufbau, Carnap says that his construction theory is neutral on the metaphysical issue of realism versus idealism. Unlike Rosado Haddock, Carnap is certainly not a realist or platonist about mathematics and logic. Perhaps we should not be reading too much of Carnap into the issue of how to understand the phenomenological reduction. It would be interesting to know how Rosado Haddock would lay out his view of the phenomenological reduction as a purely methodological procedure.

There have been debates for many years about whether or in what sense Husserl is a realist or an idealist. In the philosophy of logic and mathematics this is the issue of whether Husserl is a platonist or some kind of constructivist. Rosado Haddock's position is that Husserl is definitely a platonist, and he addresses this in a number of his essays. But it does seem to me that Husserl's transcendental turn brings nuance to the matter. Without going into the history or philosophical details I think it would be useful to distinguish between (i) adopting a Husserlian phenomenological approach toward intuitionism or constructivism, (ii) claiming that Husserl in fact was an intuitionist or constructivist, and (iii) claiming that Husserl should have been an intuitionist or constructivist given his own principles, especially after his transcendental turn. My view is that (i) is perfectly legitimate, that the textual evidence bearing on (ii) favors the view that Husserl was not an intuitionist about logic and mathematics, and that the matter regarding (iii) is not so clear.

On pages 178-181 and 241-243 Rosado Haddock discusses a very interesting unpublished manuscript of Husserl that is probably the text in which he moves most clearly in the direction of constructivism. One does not, however, see similar remarks in Husserl's later publications on logic such as Formal and Transcendental Logic (FTL) and Experience and Judgment. In FTL, for example, logic and mathematics are still said to be concerned with 'ideal' objects. The second part of the unpublished manuscript in question (from 1920), however, was composed shortly after the publication of Hermann Weyl's development of predicative analysis in Das Kontinuum (DK) (1918). DK develops a remarkable piece of constructive mathematics. It limits the use of the principle of the excluded middle, for example, and rejects the classical least upper bound principle for sets of reals. For these reasons and others, I think it goes beyond being just a mild constructivism (p. 180). Upon receipt of a copy of DK from Weyl, Husserl wrote in a 1918 letter to Weyl that "At last a mathematician . . . finds himself again on the original ground of logico-mathematical intuition, the only ground on which a really authentic foundation of mathematics and a penetration into the sense of its achievement is possible" (letter of Husserl to Weyl, April 1918).

Weyl went on to join forces for a time with Brouwer and to strongly associate intuitionism with Husserlian phenomenology, and Husserl's student and assistant Oskar Becker wrote two substantial monographs in which he mixed some ideas of phenomenology together with intuitionism. Felix Kaufmann also felt compelled to discuss intuitionism in connection with Husserl's phenomenology. In short, the waters around the platonism/constructivism issue in phenomenology are muddied by these developments. I call my own position on these matters 'constituted platonism' and thus I have sympathies with Rosado Haddock's position. However, I do think that (i) is reasonable in any case, and that the platonism/intuitionism issue should continue to be explored in connection with Husserl's work for the deep issues it raises about the relationship of human subjectivity, knowledge and intuition to mathematical and logical objectivity.

One could ask many questions about the nature and extent of Husserl's platonism in mathematics. It would be nice to see Rosado Haddock address some of them in more detail. Is Husserl a platonist about natural numbers, real numbers, or all kinds of other mathematical objects? Since most mathematical objects can be defined in terms of sets should we think of him as a platonist only about sets? Which kinds of sets? Is he a platonist about both intensional objects and extensional objects in mathematics? At several places in the book (e.g., p. 82, pp. 103-105, p. 180, pp. 241-243) Rosado Haddock describes the kind of hierarchy of categorial objectualities that is suggested in the Sixth Investigation of Husserl's LI. The idea is that once categorial objectualities are constituted in categorial intuitions of a first level, then new categorial objectualities of a second level are constituted in categorial intuition, and then new categorial objectualities of a third level, and so on. "Thus, a whole hierarchy of categorial intuitions of ever higher level serve to constitute categorial objectualities of any finite level, which build a corresponding hierarchy of categorial objectualities." (p. 103)

Rosado Haddock suggests that this hierarchy of categorial objectualities resembles the hierarchy of simple type theory and, especially, of the iterative conception of sets. Here one could ask a host of questions. For example, the description suggests some form of predicative mathematics but then what of the impredicative parts of mathematics? The replacement axiom in Zermelo-Fraenkel set theory, for example, allows impredicative specification of sets. Is this compatible with categorial intuition and the hierarchy? If it is set theory we are talking about then can we really not only intend or mean but also categorially intuit huge transfinite sets? If we cannot intuit all of the members of such sets then how are such objectualities to be constituted by finite human subjects? It seems that at most we would only be able to constitute some of the members of such sets, and in these cases there would be no rule-like (algorithmic) way to proceed with the constitution. Finer points about constitution, categorial intuition and the finite, the denumerable and the non-denumerable should be addressed, and so on.

Notwithstanding these kinds of questions, to which Rosado Haddock's responses should be of significant interest, Against the Current is a book that can be highly recommended for its unique perspective on issues in analytic philosophy, especially in relation to the long neglected contributions of Husserlian phenomenology to issues in logic, mathematics and the exact sciences. Some of the polemics in the book seem to me to distract from the solid and interesting points that Rosado Haddock often makes. His work, in any case, deserves a much wider following.

Finally, I note that there are a number of typographical errors in the book. Most significantly, the Table of Contents is two pages behind the text from chapter 9 through the Bibliography. On pages 64, 65 and 217 (twice) "round circle" should read "round square". These errors, along with some other misprints, are evidently to be corrected in copies of the book that will be distributed in the United States.