Against Voluptuous Bodies: Late Modernism and the Meaning of Painting

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J. M. Bernstein, Against Voluptuous Bodies: Late Modernism and the Meaning of Painting, Stanford University Press, 2006, 400pp., $27.95 (pbk), ISBN 0804748950.

Reviewed by Daniel Herwitz, University of Michigan


This book is a defense of modernism that begins from the assumption that modernism is inherently philosophical, being "modern art's self-consciousness of itself as an autonomous practice" (p. 2). Since this self-consciousness may appear within art-making (in some way requiring philosophical criticism to unfold it), or within theory and philosophy proper, the book is designed as a set of pairings. Modern (including some contemporary) art is read critically in conjunction with well-known philosophers and art historians, with the intention of setting up a dialectic between what the art shows and what the words offer. In each and every case, the art is meant to have, with the right philosophical instinct for soliciting it (Bernstein's own), a view of modernism as a larger social condition, and related, of what the condition of the possibility of serious art is within this social encomium. Thinking of modernism as self-revelatory, self-doubting, a self-interrogation is as old as modernism itself, and can be found in the pages of Clement Greenberg, Michael Fried, Stanley Cavell, T.J. Clark et al, who are, not surprisingly, among the various chapter titles of this book. These persons, well recited by Bernstein, are paired with artists/artworks that are often surprisingly, and sometimes brilliantly, read.

The book's ambition is a matter of the particular line it takes within this well-trod territory of philosophical modernism and its defense. Bernstein puts it this way in the opening pages:

Art's autonomy … is not the achievement of art's securing for itself a space free from the interference of social or political utility, but a consequence and so an expression of the fragmentation and reification of modern life… . Once expelled and aware of that expulsion, art then is forced to interrogate what is left to it… . (pp. 2-3)

Art is ostracized because what is left to it is incommensurate with everyday life. In particular the loss of sensory everyday visual encounter with things, people, etc… . which was central to representational art of the European past is no longer available to modern art. Its autonomy is purchased at the price of relinquishment of direct participation in the everyday, except from odd and oblique angles. Now Clement Greenberg had already argued in his mirabile dictu of modernism, "Avant-Garde and Kitsch", that the abstract turn (away from representational art) was an attempt by modernism to find a refuge against threats hurled against it by an increasingly capitalistic and technocratic modern world. Unable/unwilling to satisfy this world's demand for utilitarian and instrumentalist justifications of all things (and persons), modern abstract art retreated to the position of not representing the world, in order to keep its wellsprings of creativity, imagination and freedom alive. Modern art remained an exemplary instance of human autonomy through the imposition of a maginot line. Bernstein's read is different. Art is left reeling because of ways in which modern life has turned into fragments. And as a result of processes of capital growth and the growth of technology. This is more along the lines of Adorno, to whom Bernstein's thought is true heir.

Bernstein writes out of respect for the art he reads, finding that on his lively readings it sometimes addresses the difficult conditions of embodiment in ways better than the philosophy with which it is paired. Chaim Soutine, painter of raw flesh and butchered meat, "discovers or uncovers", in Bernstein's words, "… the secret of paint-on-canvas… its derivation from and affinity with embodiment and nature." (p. 66). I am briefly encapsulating what is a very interesting reading of Soutine, and my brief encapsulation must stand for any number of fascinating readings of modern and contemporary art throughout this book. Soutine turns out to better, more directly express a problem hit upon by Kant than Kant himself: the problem of duality according to which humans are explained as physical things on the one hand (part of nature, of the physical sciences), and maker of thoughts and inhabitor of freedom on the other. Soutine produces, courtesy of Bernstein's philosophical reading, a "transcendental induction of the conditions of human meaningfulness". The idea is therefore that art is in the same game as philosophy, solving a kind of problem set within the pages of philosophy, and doing so by means other than verbal! Soutine's is not Kant's problem exactly (how could it be!), which is why Bernstein replaces the Kantian deduction with Soutine's transcendental problem of induction. And so is Soutine inducted into the ranks of philosophy. It is fascinating to stop for a moment and consider what it would mean to refer art to a philosophical problem. Hegel had already claimed that art in its implicit way aims to reveal the deepest/metaphysical conditions of human existence, and does so -- can only do so, like philosophy -- by speaking in and through the age. If Soutine is doing this, then grand, for his study of embodiment, and the vicissitudes of the body, is one to be taken seriously by philosophy. Having said that, Bernstein's language is highly ornamental, for one can find no clear way to understand what "work" the word "induction" is doing in his remark, much less "transcendental". Placing art in the same game, on the same register, as philosophy, dignifies both, but beyond the general level of discussion -- that both are about vicissitudes of human dwelling, as body and thinker/free agent -- there seems little to say, less than he claims to say anyway.

The larger purpose for placing art and philosophy in dialectic is to show how both are responding to the particular whirl of dissociated sensibility and life that is the age of modernism/modernity (the age in which we live, or which we have inherited). Unfortunately Soutine, in being referred to philosophical problems of embodiment, is never given sufficient motivation by the social configuration of the age in which he painted. Nor for that matter is Kant. The social dynamic that apparently impels both to a similar problematic, which is philosophical, is never elaborated in sufficient detail to make the case for their adjacent sensibilities. The idea would perhaps go something like this: Kant's dualism proposing humans as artifacts of physical existence on the one hand, and freedom/thought on the other, remains unresolved because of his attachments to science on the one hand and culture on the other, and these are conceptually split because socially split. In turn Soutine's raw, unincorporated fragments of meat are a larger response to the inability of the human subject to exist within modernity's fragmented whirl. But is it? Or is it rather that Soutine is responding to village life, Jewish culture, the Kosher butcher and the ritual circumcision, the mother complex, the dislocation of émigré in Paris, what? The book never, unfortunately, raises the question of context and motivation in proper detail: this in spite of its grand opening.

I could go on about excellent readings of T.J. Clark and others. They are there and add value to this book, a great deal of value. However, it is the central organizing premise which demands discussion, since this is a book of vast ambition: that modern philosophy and modern art are embroiled in a loss of contact with ordinary reality. This premise is up to a point plausible; the question is to what point? Heidegger, Wittgenstein and company are about trying desperately to recover philosophy's role in the representation and understanding of ordinary language, action, life. Except that both take for granted the rightness of things as they are: it is only the history of the philosophical enterprise that has gone astray, or been pushed there. When Wittgenstein says the point of philosophy is to "leave things as they are", without mucking them up by impossible spider webs of philosophical imagination, argument and system, he is laying his life down as at one with ordinary life. Is this estrangement or not? Well it's an accommodation that can seem too little, given that philosophy is no longer a player in things, but rather a fly on the wall of human life, merely watching, as if at the cinema. But Heidegger embraces ordinary thought with a hammer, taking its point while also vastly critiquing its deformations (as he sees it). This is not a person, in my view, pushed out of the field of ordinary life and debate, unless by pushed you mean not having a central role in public life. But Habermas did, and Dewey. The more one goes into it, the less one is convinced of Bernstein's big picture. And it is the same with art. On the one hand Soutine, on the other Picasso and Braque, who celebrate ordinary things (the glass of pernod, the mandolin, the daily newspaper), while also sending them reeling into compositions in which they amalgamate with words and synergize with the human figure. Is this estrangement, or identification with things ordinary? And is the world it pictures one of experience fragmented or rather, singular, absorptive, a bit of everything?

We now live in a consumer culture and art is hardly estranged from that, even if it would shock and repel old modernists (not Picasso). Those modernists ended up overvalued in market share because of the boldness of their language, the self-assertion of their forms. A bold, self-important voice is one that sells. The avant-gardes are implicated in the capitalism they might (or might not) have taken refuge from, and in virtue of the self-majesty of their pronouncements, theories, self-beliefs, as for any other reason. They are a central part in late capitalist ordinary life, insofar as it is consumer life. And of various attitudes. For every Richter there is a Warhol. Which is the authentic modernist? Is Warhol a modernist at all? Both the premise that experience is impossibly fragmented, and that modernism is its skeptical, desperate self-consciousness, are questionable. The book, convinced of its premise, seems not to take on these questions.