Agency and Deontic Logic

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Horty, John F., Agency and Deontic Logic, Oxford University Press, 2001, 192 pp, $32.00 (hbk), ISBN 0-195-13461-3.

Reviewed by Paul Bartha, University of British Columbia


Deontic logic is the logic of ethical concepts such as obligation and permission. While the subject has always been of interest to modal logicians, and in the past decade or so to computer scientists developing normative systems, deontic logic has been in moderate crisis for some time. The first source of crisis is internal. Early efforts to formalize our intuitions about inferences involving obligation led to a number of stubborn paradoxes and logical puzzles. Attempts to address these problems have resulted in an almost bewildering proliferation of different systems of deontic logic — at least one per deontic logician, as some have quipped — so that innovation inevitably meets with a certain amount of skepticism and fatigue. The second source of crisis is external. Philosophers such as Geach have charged that current work in the field has only limited relevance to ethical reasoning about the obligations incumbent upon actual agents. Deontic logicians surely ought to have something to say about such matters!

Happily, Horty’s Agency and Deontic Logic represents a major advance in the field, developing fresh ideas for thinking about longstanding internal problems and making significant connections with external areas of research, most notably decision theory and utilitarian ethical theory. Furthermore, although the book is technically sophisticated, the discussion is exceptionally clear and readable and benefits greatly from numerous examples and diagrams. Agency and Deontic Logic should interest an audience that includes logicians, computer scientists and those working in decision theory, game theory and ethics as well as applications of these disciplines. Perhaps the greatest contribution provided by the book is the development of a clear framework for thinking about — and indeed, for picturing — problematic inferences that arise when thinking about relationships between obligations. That is just what deontic logic should contribute.

Horty’s central theses, following von Wright and Geach, are that deontic logic needs to distinguish between evaluative statements that indicate what ought to be the case and prescriptive statements that indicate what particular agents ought to do, and that deontic reasoning is characteristically about the latter rather than the former. Most deontic logics after von Wright attempted to assimilate the ought-to-do to the ought-to-be, partly because there was a clear ‘possible-world’ semantics for ought-to-be statements and partly because “Arthur ought to visit his mother” and “It ought to be that Arthur visits his mother” appeared to be equivalent. The idea of the possible world semantics is roughly that “It ought to be that p” is true in our world just in case p is true in all “ideal” possible worlds accessible from ours. With a simple but completely convincing example, Horty shows why this analysis fails when p represents an action by some agent. Faced with a choice between gambling $5 on the toss of a coin (double or nothing) or not gambling, most of us would conclude that there is no obligation to gamble. Yet in the best possible accessible world (at least from your point of view), you take the gamble and win $10, so that the possible world semantics implies that it ought to be that you take the gamble. (That this conclusion follows regardless of probabilistic considerations is doubly strange.) Consequently, “I ought to gamble” and “It ought to be that I gamble” are not equivalent.

Horty develops a completely new semantics for the ought-to-do by building on the formal semantics for agency developed by Belnap, Perloff and Xu (Facing the Future, Oxford, 2001). The early chapters of his book first explain Belnap’s branching-time semantics for statements of the form “agent a sees to it that p”, known as stit sentences, and then explore the natural strategy of combining Belnap’s framework with the traditional ‘possible-world’ semantics by construing “a ought to see to it that p” as “It ought to be that a sees to it that p”. Possible worlds are replaced by histories, which are sequences of moments. The strategy is then to assign each history a value, and to regard “It ought to be that a sees to it that p” as true at a moment m if (roughly) “a sees to it that p” is true at all the best or optimal histories containing the moment m. Although this account has some success in resolving traditional puzzles, it still falls afoul of the gambling objection just discussed.

Horty solves this problem by incorporating into his semantics for the ought-to-do some basic ideas from decision theory, most notably dominance reasoning. One action dominates another if the payoff of the first is at least as good as the payoff of the second under every circumstance and is strictly better under some circumstances. Horty’s proposal, roughly speaking, is that “a ought to see to it that p” is true at some moment just in case every action available to a at that moment that fails to guarantee that p is dominated by an action that does guarantee that p. This solves the gambling problem because refraining from gambling is not dominated by gambling. You cannot guarantee the best outcome (gambling and winning), so gambling does not under every circumstance produce a better outcome than not gambling.

Subsequent chapters of the book extend this initial analysis to a treatment of conditional obligations, group oughts and strategic oughts involving a sequence of choices. Each chapter begins by broadening the framework with a set of clear definitions and examples and some basic logical relationships. Horty then applies the expanded framework to give precise analyses of competing philosophical claims, using examples drawn from deontic logic and from a much wider philosophical literature.

Apart from achieving his central objective of providing a novel, rigorous analysis of the ought-to-do, Horty offers solutions to a number of traditional puzzles about agency and obligation. He also provides insightful accounts of metaphysical issues, such as causal independence of agents. The book’s most significant applications, however, pertain to the clarification of controversies within ethics. Horty is explicit that his theory is broadly utilitarian, but he shows that it is possible to formulate and compare a variety of act and rule utilitarian principles. This is especially impressive given that his framework has no way, at present, to represent probabilistic information. One particularly interesting result is a demonstration that while particular versions of act and rule utilitarianism do not always agree upon which actions are right, we can define plausible versions that are compatible in the following sense: so long as one can find actions classified as right by each of these ethical theories, one can always find an action that is classified as right under both theories. Here and elsewhere, Horty’s framework enables us to formulate and compare different ideas in a precise manner. His examples, presented visually with diagrams or “stit models”, are extremely helpful in clarifying our intuitions about complex issues. By working through these examples carefully, readers will come to appreciate the flexibility and potential range of Horty’s framework.

Perhaps the principal limitation of Agency and Deontic Logic is its emphasis on utilitarian ethical theories. On the one hand, this reflects a reasonable choice on Horty’s part, since he is able to “close the gap” between deontic logic and this particular type of ethical theory in a compact fashion. On the other hand, the same even-handed spirit in which Horty models different positions within utilitarianism without taking sides might also be extended to contrast utilitarianism with other types of ethical theory, most notably contractarian approaches. There is a natural way to model such theories within a “stit” framework; furthermore, only within contractarian models can the game theoretic insights that Horty so successfully begins to incorporate into deontic logic be fully realized.

The way to model contractarian theories is to permit the evaluation of actions, or histories, to vary relative to different agents or groups of agents, and to move from a numerical evaluation function to a preference ordering that may only be partial. To suppose that each history has a single, agent-independent numerical value is to assume unproblematically that we have a totally ordered social welfare function that coincides with each agent’s individual welfare function. This is an assumption that can be justified only within a utilitarian context. To make this supposition leaves no space for the conflicts between individual utility-maximization and collective welfare that have bedeviled rational choice theory. For instance, Horty is able to prove that if a group makes a collective choice at some moment that is optimal or “right” under “orthodox” act utilitarianism, then each individual in the group must also be making a choice that counts as optimal. There appears to be no scope here for Prisoners Dilemmas or similar difficulties. A more general framework along the lines suggested, however, would allow us to model such situations.

Some of Horty’s examples do, in fact, appear to pre-suppose a distinction between individual utility and overall welfare. The gambling problem discussed above postulates that the outcome where agent a gambles and wins $10 is better than the outcome where a declines the gamble and keeps just $5, but this is only true if the evaluations are made by a. If we give the utility of the bookie equal weight (and assume utility is proportional to monetary gain or loss for small sums), we have a zero-sum game and the example fails: all outcomes are equally good. To be sure, the gambling problem could be modified to avoid this objection – perhaps with a story involving a decision between banning or allowing research with the potential for some great universal benefit (cheap energy) but also terrible harm (nuclear disaster). My point is simply that the distinction between individual welfare and collective welfare is a natural one that we should, at the very least, retain the option of modeling.

The above remarks, of course, are also intended to convince potential readers that Horty’s framework is not limited to modeling debates internal to utilitarianism, but has much greater potential. As Horty states, the book follows a “narrow path through some difficult terrain, leaving much of the surrounding territory unexplored.” Further explorations are sure to be fruitful.