Agency and Self-Awareness: Issues in Philosophy and Psychology

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Johannes Roessler and Naomi Eilan (eds.), Agency and Self-Awareness: Issues in Philosophy and Psychology, Oxford, 2003, 400pp, $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 0199245622

Reviewed by Brie Gertler, University of Wisconsin, Madison


This fine collection comprises seventeen articles by philosophers and psychologists, and a comprehensive introduction by the co-editors. The 47-page introduction, entitled “Agency and Self-Awareness: Mechanisms and Epistemology”, provides a superb entrée to both the topic of the collection and the experimental work the various authors draw upon; it is worth the price of admission on its own. The articles address a range of issues in the epistemology of action, with the overall focus on the following questions. What process do we use in determining that we are acting, as opposed to merely intending to act, or merely moving? What is involved in “owning” an action, i.e., in acknowledging the action as one’s own? Does the process we use in identifying others’ actions differ from the process we use in identifying our own? Do we enjoy special access to, or first-person authority about, our own actions?

Of course, in answering these questions one must operate with some notion of what an action is; the authors tend to use fairly clear-cut instances of actions, and not to offer an analysis of ’action’. (Though some do make novel suggestions about the requirements for agency, drawing on fascinating pathological cases that strain our intuitions.) Nor do they attempt to rebut arguments that contest the distinction between actions and mere movements. These choices are wise, as they allow for a well-focused collection that delves deeply into the issues it does address.

Because I cannot deal with all of the contributions, this review will, regrettably, be limited; in particular, I will neglect some of the excellent chapters written by psychologists.

In “The Sense of Agency: Awareness and Ownership of Action”, Anthony Marcel argues that knowledge that one is acting derives from a sense of effort that standardly accompanies action. This sense of effort is the phenomenological aspect of “that which translates intention into movement”, viz., the forming and initiating of an action plan. Marcel marshals a variety of experimental results to support this account. For instance, normal subjects faced with visual illusions exhibit the Roeloff Effect: asked to move a hand towards a target, the subject will tailor her movements correctly, even when confronted with a visual illusion that makes it appear that the target has shifted to another location. But verbal reports about the location of the target reflect the illusion. Marcel claims that while the information processed in the action plan may not be accessible to verbal report, it is the phenomenology of effort involved in the action plan that gives rise to the subject’s sense of agency.

John Campbell provides a similar explanation of the Roeloff Effect, in “The Role of Demonstratives in Action Explanation”, by use of a helpful analogy. Actions are directed jointly by conscious perception and by the lower-level ’action pathway’, much as a heat-seeking missile is aimed by an initial targeting (analogous to an initial plan based on conscious perceptual information), and its trajectory is later adjusted according to heat detection (analogous to the information processed at the inaccessible action pathway).

The division between what is accessible to the subject and what affects actual performance is also present in pathological cases such as the Anarchic Hand. A patient with lesions to the Supplementary Motor Area perceptually observes his hand involved in what seems to be agentive activity, such as unbuttoning a shirt. But he does not experience this action as his own. In fact, the action may be at cross purposes with an explicit intention of his, e.g., to button the shirt. Remarkably, the patients do report proprioceptive awareness of the hand’s movement. And the clear goal-directedness of the behavior suggests that there must be some intention that fuels it. (Though Christopher Peacocke, in his chapter, rejects a related claim, that goal-directed behavior must be driven by an event of trying.) Marcel proposes that, in such a case, the patient is unaware of “the perspectivalness of the source of the action”, viz., the spatial specifications involved in the action plan. Implicit awareness of this perspectivalness in ordinary subjects explains the sense of owning an action: the motor specification for acting is given in egocentric space, and thereby implicates the agent as the spatial source of the action.

Campbell uses the separation of perceptual and action pathways, exhibited in other pathological cases, to argue that perceptual demonstratives are not given their meaning by actual parameters for action: patients with some sorts of damage may correctly perceive an object’s location while being unable to act on this information, while blindsighters may act on objects that they cannot perceptually demonstrate. Blindsighters lack the ability to consciously attend to various basic attributes of the object; so they are unable to “bind” these attributes together, to specify the object as a single target of action. Their actions on the object are controlled by these individual attributes and are not guided by a larger conception of the object.

Peacocke, in “Action: Awareness, Ownership, and Knowledge”, argues against Marcel’s claim that the sense of agency arises from the phenomenology associated with formulating an action plan (in particular, with specifying a movement in egocentric space). First, he notes that actions can be mental as well as bodily, and that purely mental actions do not involve egocentric motor specifications. Hence, Marcel’s proposal will not provide a unified account of our sense of agency. There are two avenues of response open to Marcel: he might simply deny that the sense of agency can be explained by a unified account; or, more plausibly, he might argue that some analogue of an egocentrically-oriented action plan is available in the mental case.

Peacocke’s second objection to Marcel stems from the observation that in the Anarchic Hand case, there is an action plan—e.g., the plan to “unbutton my shirt”—that is specified in egocentric space. But Anarchic Hand subjects precisely disavow the action in question. Presumably, Marcel would respond by distinguishing the egocentric spatial specifications from awareness thereof, and by claiming that in Anarchic Hand the action plan lacks its standard phenomenology, which affords awareness of one’s own efforts. This response, while adequate on its own, reveals a possible weakness of Marcel’s proposal. That proposal relies on the idea that egocentric motor specification produces a distinctive phenomenology, one that suffices to give the sense of ownership but whose content is not the egocentric motor specification itself. (After all, the Roeloff effect shows that the motor specifications are not generally accessible to the subject.) The worry is that the experience of effort, and hence the sense of ownership, bears no obvious relation to the egocentric motor specification from which it purportedly derives.

For his part, Peacocke claims that knowledge that one is acting is, roughly, the product of two factors: (i) “awareness from the inside of trying to Ø” (where ’Ø’ is a basic action, e.g., moving one’s arm, not an action performed by performing some other action, e.g., casting a vote); and (ii) the entitlement to presume that one is in those circumstances that make a trying to Ø an event that results in Ø -ing. Peacocke’s account has the advantage of generality: it applies to mental actions as well as bodily actions, for both involve ’trying’. But much needs to be filled in before the account can be evaluated. For instance, how can we explain the goal-directedness of the Anarchic Hand behavior, given that no one is “trying” to unbutton the shirt? Most importantly, the notion of “a trying to Ø” must be explicated. Some of his remarks suggest that a trying is an externalistically individuated conscious mental event. But then does proprioceptive and kinaesthetic experience make no contribution to our awareness of agency? The denial that sensory experience contributes to knowledge of agency, while plausible, makes acute the need to explain what awareness “from the inside” amounts to. This is especially pressing since, given Peacocke’s objections to Marcel, he cannot appeal to egocentric space in an account of such awareness.

By focusing on tryings as conscious states to which a subject has some sort of special access, Peacocke in effect supports a project undertaken by Lucy O’Brien, in her chapter “On Knowing One’s Own Actions”. O’Brien wants to “move away from a general passivism about the psychological… [and] from the idea that the basic case of a mental phenomenon is a mental state or disposition.” (359) Towards this end, she seeks to show that some hallmarks of mental states — that they are the province of first-person authority, knowable without the use of sensory evidence, and generally transparent — apply equally to actions. She accounts for these epistemic features of actions (active mental events) by claiming that they constitute reasons for their own ascription. This is possible, on her view, because actions are conscious in that they occupy our attention; they needn’t be the object of a separate state of attention.

In “The Epistemology of Physical Action”, Brian O’Shaughnessy presents a view that is similar to O’Brien’s, in that it construes actions (in his terminology, “willings”) as epistemologically on a par with other psychological events. And both of these philosophers stress that one knows that one is acting directly, and that this knowledge doesn’t require a distinct state constituting attention to or experience of one’s acting. This sort of proposal is promising, but the epistemological details need to be fleshed out. In particular, it’s not clear how this view resolves a problem O’Brien finds with Peacocke’s “no-reasons” account of self-knowledge, namely, that it specifies conditions for self-knowledge without explaining precisely how the purported knowledge occurs.

While O’Shaughnessy broadly agrees with O’Brien’s position on knowledge of actions, his larger theory includes a distinctive ontology of willings. Willings are, he says, simultaneously mental and physical; this is his “dual aspect” theory, defended at length in his 1980 two-volume treatise, The Will. On this view an act of willing doesn’t cause bodily movement, but rather incorporates it. (And, strikingly, the direct grasp of an event of willing affords . priori knowledge of its physical nature.) In his chapter, O’Shaughnessy focuses on arguing that events of willing are experiences, since they share the epistemological features that characterize experiences. But he denies that willings have a phenomenological feel, presuming that if they did, knowledge of an event of willing would require a discrete event that was an experience of the willing experience. I don’t see the grounds for this presumption. Why not say that one simply experiences one’s experiences, and feels one’s feelings, simply by virtue of having them? In that case, they might be known by their phenomenological feel, even without a distinct state that registers that feel.

In contrast to O’Shaughnessy and O’Brien, who stress that knowledge of one’s own actions is independent of perception, Johannes Roessler and Joëlle Proust both see the use of perceptual attention as crucial to such knowledge. They each argue that, when an action involves an “intention-in-action” (one that shapes the action as it proceeds and is not merely prior to the action), the action is shaped by our perception of affordances (available courses of action). In “Intentional Action and Self-Awareness”, Roessler claims that awareness that one is acting stems from one’s selective attention to certain affordances, which one uses to guide action. And, like O’Shaughnessy and O’Brien, he describes an action as an active event that we can directly grasp; we avoid Sartrean bad faith by grasping the event not via a mere observation, but via commitment to the act. “When you attend ’from within the act’, your knowledge that the arm is moving cannot be detached from your knowledge that you are moving it. You acquire knowledge of both facts in perceiving the movement with a sense of control.” (400) Presumably, this “sense of control” is the phenomenological accompaniment of exploiting perceived affordances to which the agent selectively attends.

In a chapter titled “Perceiving Intentions”, Proust also argues that selective attention to affordances yields a phenomenology, which she calls simply “the phenomenology of effort”. The presence of phenomenology is one of her five conditions for perception. Other conditions include: that the process makes use of specialized captors, that it can be veridical or illusory, etc. Her central claim is that knowledge of one’s own actions meets all five conditions, and thus is a species of perceptual knowledge. Because we directly perceive others’ movements as actions, she concludes, “there is a common source of knowledge for self and others’ intentional behaviour” (297). She appears to be claiming only a general commonality here, since on her view knowledge of one’s own actions specifically involves proprioception, which plays no obvious role in knowledge of others’ actions. As with the other accounts, many of the details of Roessler’s and Proust’s strategy remain to be filled in—e.g., what precisely is the phenomenology of control or effort, and how is it related to more familiar aspects of perceptual phenomenology?

In their contributions, Josef Perner (“Dual Control and the Causal Theory of Action: The Case of Non-intentional Action”) and Thomas Baldwin (“Perception and Agency”) relate agency to larger issues about the mind: the nature of consciousness (Perner) and the requirements for subjectivity (Baldwin). Like Marcel and Campbell, Perner distinguishes levels of awareness in action: a higher level that specifies the action to be undertaken and a lower level responsible for carrying out the specified action. He also maintains that the higher level is distinguished by being conscious, conceptually sophisticated, and accessible to the subject. But Perner has a more ambitious agenda, namely, to explain consciousness by the features of the higher level—in particular, by its conceptual explicitness. He calls the resulting view “the 1 1/2-order-thought theory of consciousness”. The choice of “1 1/2” is intended to distinguish his view from standard Higher-Order Thought (HOT) theories of consciousness, which might be termed 2nd-order thought theories. But, he says, his view will “still capture the intuitions behind these [HOT] theories, in particular the notion that conscious knowledge of a fact implies some knowledge that one knows that fact.” (233) This seems inaccurate on two counts. First, HOT theories aren’t motivated by (or committed to) any such claim about meta-knowledge; at most, they require that conscious states are states we’re aware of. Second, the relation between Perner’s lower-level and higher-level states doesn’t seem to be a difference in orders, in the sense that higher-level states are directed on lower-level ones. I should note, however, that neither of these objections threatens the substance of Perner’s substantial view, as they both concern how he characterizes the view.

Baldwin’s principal claim is that perceptual consciousness entails a capacity for agency. As I understand his argument, it goes roughly as follows: perceptual consciousness yields reasons for belief; as Moore Paradoxes show, beliefs are commitments, i.e., they constitute reasons for action; and to have a reason for action is to be capable of rational action. “So a person who is a subject of perceptual consciousness needs to be someone who is capable of rational action”. (200) (I should say that I’m not entirely sure this is the correct interpretation of his argument.) Now if “rational action” is used in its usual factive sense, this conclusion seems too strong. Surely irrational subjects—if there are such—are capable of perceptual consciousness, as are subjects suffering from total paralysis. Of course, paralytic subjects may nonetheless undertake mental actions, e.g., exercises of imagination. And perhaps it is ultimately mental actions that provide the basis for Baldwin’s argument: he agrees with Naomi Eilan’s claim that perceptual consciousness requires perceptual attention, and attending may itself be a species of rational action. But if this were his strategy, the premises concerning belief would have nothing to contribute.

I want to close this review with some reflections prompted by the idea of mental activity, present in most of the chapters discussed here. Whatever one’s ontology of action, it seems relatively uncontroversial that mental actions, such as deliberately conjuring an image of one’s grandmother, are directly known if any actions are. (And as Peacocke argues, no full account of action can ignore mental actions.) But how do I know that I’m acting, when I (apparently) imagine my grandmother? There seems to be nothing incoherent in supposing that the relevant phenomenology (of effort or control) is present, while the image of my grandmother is somehow imposed upon my thought by an outside force. This doesn’t justify skepticism about mental actions, of course. But it does highlight the fact that action attributions are a species of causal claim. As such, the epistemology of action faces some familiar worries, worries that owe as much to Hume as to Descartes. How can knowledge of any causal relation be direct? How can knowledge of an “active” mental event, as such, be on a par with knowledge of a particular static mental state? For those primarily interested in these sorts of epistemological questions, the volume may prove unsatisfying, since its focus lies elsewhere.

The collection is certainly required reading for anyone interested in action theory or the role of agency in self-conception. It will also be useful for those who work on self-knowledge and the philosophy of psychology. The articles not discussed in this review are as follows.


Patrick Haggard, “Conscious Awareness of Intention and of Action”

Marc Jeannerod, “Consciousness of Action and Self-Consciousness: A Cognitive Neuroscience Approach”

Wolfgang Prinz, “Experimental Approaches to Action”

Glyn W. Humphreys and M. Jane Riddoch, “Fractioning the Intentional Control of Behaviour: A Neuropsychological Analysis”

Douglas Frye and Philip David Zelazo, “The Development of Young Children’s Action Control and Awareness”

Jennifer Hornsby, “Children’s Action Control and Awareness: Comment on Frye and Zelazo”

Michael Lewis, “The Development of Self-Consciousness”

Jérôme Dokic, “The Sense of Ownership: An Analogy between Sensation and Action”