Aggression and Crimes Against Peace

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Larry May, Aggression and Crimes Against Peace, Cambridge University Press, 2008, 356pp., $27.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521719155.

Reviewed by Douglas Lackey, Baruch College/Graduate Center, CUNY


When the Rome Statute defined the International Criminal Court in 1998, the crime of aggression was listed as falling under its jurisdiction. But the court held that it could not indict any party for aggression until "aggression" had been defined, and a commission was established in 2002 to define the term. The commission has since met in various urban venues, and will present its report to the ICC in 2010, thereby exceeding by a factor of 4 (eight years to two) the time it took the UN General Assembly to define "aggression" back in 1974.

Subsequent to the inception of the commission and before its final report, Larry May has published, with Cambridge University Press, no less than three elegant books (why should this not surprise us?) on war related crimes, the first on crimes against humanity (2005), the second on war crimes proper (2007) and the latest (2008) on the crime of aggression. American conservatives will chalk this up to superior productivity in the private sector, though I doubt they would be pleased with the cosmopolitan contents of these books. The three together might be called May's "Nuremberg Trilogy," as their titles and division of material are obviously modeled on the primary indictments delivered at Nuremberg in 1946.

What May proposes to do in his latest book is to "reconceptualize" the concept of aggression. The old concept, from 1974, and the one that the ICC is committed to using as a working basis, stems from UN GA resolution 3314:

Aggression is the use of armed force by a State against the sovereignty, territorial integrity or political independence of another State, or in any other manner inconsistent with the Charter of the United Nations, as set out in this Definition … first use of force by an armed state shall constitute prima facie evidence of an act of aggression.

Now, according to May, this definition is too broad and too narrow. It is too broad because there may be cases in which the use of force against state sovereignty is not aggression, such as the use of force for purposes of humanitarian intervention. It is too narrow because sub-state groups like terrorist organizations can engage in acts of aggression, when, May writes, they "act like states."

In what follows I will focus mainly on state aggression (the ICC is already leaning towards defining aggression as a "state crime"). May's prima facie conditions (p. 220) for state aggression are:

A state is engaged in illegal aggression when that state:

1. has been the first to use violent force in a confrontation against another state that jeopardizes basic human rights;

2. has not been provoked, or if provoked, the provocations do not constitute an imminent or immediate threat to it;

3. has not acted in self-defense or defense of other states or subgroups of a state; and

4. has not been authorized by the UN to use violent force against another state.

From this humble beginning May refines and elaborates his case, with special professional care given to bridging the gap (via mens rea and the absence of described excusing conditions) between the judgment, "a crime has been committed" and the judgment "this individual is guilty of this crime." Along the way, various champions of just war theory, particularly Grotius, Vitoria, and Vattel, are rounded up as support or foils.

May characterizes his first condition, blending "human rights" into the definition of "aggression," as changing the focus of analysis from "first strike" to "first wrong." Instead of asking, "who threw the first punch?" the new question should be "who committed the first injustice?" If there is an injustice prior to any military action, if the injustice is serious and if only military action will remedy it, May feels that the use of force to remedy injustice is not aggression and is no crime. May's book, however, is shy on examples, even imaginary ones, so we must consider some of our own to figure out how clause (1) is going to operate. Would it not be aggression if Morocco invaded France, or if Iraq invaded Turkey, in order to stop the injustice of preventing Muslim girls from wearing head scarves to school? Would it not be aggression if Canadian military forces invaded the US to stop the execution of criminals in Detroit?

May calls himself a "contingent pacifist," and believes that his conditions for just war are almost never satisfied. He would probably reply that the injustices described here are not serious enough and not widespread enough to let slip the dogs of war. But what cases are serious enough? If we take the true measure of the harms of war to the innocent (which are invariably underestimated, since the dead cannot protest and the grieving maintain hysterically that war deaths must have some meaning) one needs be attacking a very big injustice to evade clause (1). It must be something like freeing the southern slaves or saving the Jews, but since neither Lincoln nor Roosevelt had these ends in mind, mens rea issues may obtrude.

The simplest (and perhaps sole) case would be "stopping a genocide in progress," like the Indian invasion of Pakistan in 1971. But even in this case, one wonders why we must say (with May) that first strike war to stop genocide is a justified use of force and not aggression, rather than saying that it is aggression, but that such aggression is excusable. After all, the Indian action had all the eminently salient features ordinarily associated with aggression, first use of force, border crossings, intent to overthrow the government (at least in East Pakistan). My colleague Omar Dahbour has written eloquently about the importance of borders, to which May gives rather short shrift. Perhaps "stopping genocide" should be made a specific defense against the charge of aggression, and the 1974 definition, with its clarity and plausibility, let stand.

The examples above show that May's "first wrong, not first strike" doctrine may create intractable problems of justifiability. The same goes for the "provocation" clause. Did the United States provoke Japan into attacking Pearl Harbor by closing off Japanese access to Indonesian oil? Did the Japanese provoke the Americans to cut off the oil because of their invasions of Manchuria and China? Was the occupation of the American embassy in Tehran unprovoked, or did the Americans provoke it by toppling Mossadegh in 1953? These are fascinating problems, but not ones that one would ever want to see debated in an international court, allowing future Milosevics once again to seize center stage.

May's discussion of clause (3) shows him willing to liberalize the strictures of UN Charter art. 51, which permits self-defense only "in the event of armed attack." Cases of pre-emption, he argues (why does a "contingent pacifist" want to make it easier to justify war?), are sometimes not aggression. My difficulty is both with May and the general presumption, present equally in art. 51, that collective state self-defense is a straightforward extension of individual state self-defense. Suppose that fighting a just war is like permissibly swerving Philippa Foot's runaway trolley. If I have a right to self-defense, I can swerve the trolley away from myself towards a group of five. But a bystander cannot permissibly swerve the trolley away from me towards the group of five, even if the bystander is my ally. Collective defense of an attacked individual state has special consequentialist limits that few authors have surveyed. And if the trolley analogy is correct, we can speak of "swerving a first strike," another reason to retain the 1974 analysis of aggression.

One ambiguity in these discussions is whether we are talking about the crime of aggression in general or the crime of aggressive war. While the Nuremberg indictment speaks of "aggressive war," it is clear that the ICC and May in this book always have aggressive war in mind. But if eight years are to be spent defining aggression, non-military aggression might be considered. Suppose, for example, Russia declared that unless Slovakia provides Russia with uranium at the right price, the supply of Russian natural gas will be shut off. Slovakia refuses, Russia turns off the gas, and ten thousand elderly Slovaks die of the winter cold. Is this not aggression by Russia against Slovakia? Shouldn't there be international remedies and even criminal sanctions in such a case? Furthermore, if we expand the concept of aggression beyond the confines of aggressive war, we have no difficulty classifying terrorist acts as acts of aggression, even if they lack significant features of military operations.

May has a powerful legal mind and a deep emotional aversion to war. In this book it often seems that his head is at war with his heart. The result is a book with a lot of logical turbulence and swirling analytical circles. Readers will enjoy the spectacle of a storm in progress.