Agir en vertu d’un autre: Thomas d’Aquin et l’ontologie de l’instrument

Agir En Vertu D Un Autre

Charles Ehret, Agir en vertu d’un autre: Thomas d’Aquin et l’ontologie de l’instrument, Vrin, 2021, 235pp., $37.00 (pbk) ISBN 9782711630066.

Reviewed by Cyrille Michon, Université de Nantes


If I move a stone with a stick, what does the stick contribute? To say that it causes the movement of the stone is to attribute to it more than its own capacity. But should we say that it contributes nothing to the movement of the stone and that I am the only cause? For the Scholastics, a similar questioning also arose concerning the relationship between God and creatures. What is the effectiveness of the so-called “secondary causes”? How can we avoid removing God's status as the principal agent without falling into occasionalism? The notion of an instrumental cause, often invoked in this context by Thomas Aquinas, seeks to reconcile the primacy of the principal agent (God or the artisan) with the efficacy of the instrument. The idea is that an action passes through the instrument to produce an effect that is beyond the capacity of the latter (as the saw could not make a bench) and that will be properly attributed to the former. This transitivity is mysterious.

In an outstanding book, Charles Ehret defends an interpretation of Aquinas’s account of this mystery, of the transitivity and more generally of the ontology (nature and mode of existence) of the instrument.

The main thesis is that Aquinas uses two models of instrumental causality, but that one—the Aristotelian, physical model of the moved mover—fails because it is caught in a contradiction that the other—the Neoplatonic, metaphysical model of the virtus fluens (flowing power)—avoids. A pars destruens then is followed by a pars construens. To quote from the conclusion: “the instrument is not a moved mover, because the notion of a moved mover is contradictory, but it is that which acts by virtue of another, and what allows one thing to act by virtue of another is that a virtus, that is to say a power, is a transient property, because a power has intentional being, in the manner of a sensible appearance” (211). Taken up from the analysis of the sacraments, the model is generalized to all kinds of instruments, and finally to all causal powers.

Aware of the traditional opposition between the two historical influences (Neoplatonism and Avicenna vs Aristotle read by Averroes) on the thought of Aquinas, Ehret argues that Thomas builds from them an original conception which assimilates and sometimes diverts the ideas of his predecessors. In fact, the book’s argument relies on numerous and often very innovative intermediate analyses of the texts of Aristotle, of his Ancient (Alexander, Philoponus, Simplicius) and Arab (Avicenna, Averroes) commentators, of Albert the Great, and of course of Thomas himself. All of which is well-informed by recent scholarship.

The first part, “Physics of the Instrument: the Moved Mover”, is the pars destruens of the book.

In the first chapter, Ehret defends the surprising, but not absolutely new (Philoponus and then Simplicius have raised the issue), thesis that the Aristotelian definition of motion (“the actuality of that which is in potency, as such” often rendered as “actualization of what is potentially, as such”) is incompatible with the notion of a moved mover. The existence of moved movers (like the stick moving the stone) is a truth of experience. But the Aristotelian analysis of motion must be understood as a reduction of motion to the concepts of potency and actuality (and not the passage or process from one to the other, which would be a circular account). Ehret thus defends the actuality view against the process view of the commentators. He shows that this reading was also that of Thomas, who defines motion as an imperfect actuality (actus imperfectus), a medium between the two terms, an incomplete realization of the terminal act (like lukewarm water), irreducible to pure potentiality (cold water that can be hot) and pure actuality (water that is actually hot). Such an understanding of motion makes it impossible for a moved body to be a mover “at the same time and in the same respect”, since it is potentially what the mover must be actually. The notion of a moved mover is of interest only if we restrict it to that of a mover moving a mobile at the same time and because it is moved by a motion of the same nature. It is this notion that Aristotle applies to the instrumental cause (the stick that pushes the stone by being pushed by the hand), when establishing the existence of a first immobile mover at the end of the chain of moved movers, and it is this notion that his definition of motion makes impossible. Aristotle defends the possibility of moved movers otherwise understood by means of a precise case (Phys. III 2, 205a5–9): the existence of the reciprocal motion of the agent on the patient and of the patient on the agent (the source of heat heats a body which, in return, causes its cooling). However, reciprocal motion does not link two motions of the same kind, but two opposing motions, in a closed circuit. It cannot therefore give rise to a moved mover in the required sense, and even less to a chain of moved movers. A mover can only be moved during the time it is moving a mobile by a motion of another kind than the one by which it is moved, and if it can be moved by a motion of the same kind, it can only be at another time.

In a sense, the inadequacy of the physical model of the moved mover is already established by this first chapter. The next two chapters nevertheless consider two remarkable “theoretical effects” of the problem of the moved mover in the Physics, which contribute to reinforcing the pars destruens: the possibility of an eternal world, and the failure of the proof of the first mover.

In chapter 2, Ehret shows that Aristotle himself gave an argument against the possibility of a moved mover at the beginning of book V of the Physics, where he argues that no motion leads by itself to another motion (but only to a fixed state). This argument was added by the Scholastics to those of Aristotle in favor of the eternity of the world. The thesis of the independence of motions allows one to maintain that a chain of movers, like that of generations, can exist because their relation is accidental (Socrates's father is only accidentally the son of another). And the chain can be infinite (and the world eternal) without breaking the prohibition concerning actual infinity, as Philoponus wanted, because this prohibition applies only to infinity per se (= due to an essential relation between its constituents). Ehret argues that, for Aquinas, the possibility of an infinite by accident does not so much rely on the fact that causes act successively (an explanation which Thomas retained for a time, in the Sentences) but rather on the impossibility of an essential subordination of causes of the same kind for a single effect (such that the cause of the cause is also the cause of the effect of the cause). Thomas, after Aristotle, refuses causal overdetermination. Same kind causes cannot be ordered in an infinite chain for the same effect because they cannot constitute a chain at all. Obviously, this argument bears also against the possibility of moved movers, and undermines the argument for a first immobile mover (since every mover is immobile).

This is the subject of chapter 3. Following Aristotle’s demonstration, after the impossibility of an infinite chain of moved movers and the necessity of a first mover, one important step toward the immobility of the first mover is the impossibility of an initial self-mover, which would necessarily move and be moved “at the same time and in the same respect”. Thomas sees that Aristotle’s rejection of the self-mover seems to reach any mover moved by a motion of the same nature as the one it exerts. He answers that the contradiction of the self-mover comes from the fact that it should move (itself) and be moved (by itself) by a numerically unique motion. But that is not the case of the other moved movers: they are moved by a motion identical in nature but numerically distinct from the one by which they move (the motion by which the stick is moved by the hand is of the same nature but is not the one by which it moves the stone). The moved mover would thus escape the objection to the self-mover. Ehret shows that this way out had already been taken by Alexander of Aphrodisias, and that it had been answered by Simplicius, both exegetically and philosophically. Aristotle is really talking about the impossibility of moving and being moved by a motion of the same kind, and not only by a motion identical in number. And this is sound: not only can I not teach myself something I already know (overdetermination of the self-mover), but I cannot teach anyone else something I am learning from anyone else, at the same time and in the same respect (underdetermination of the moved mover).

The pars construens, “Metaphysics of the Instrument—Acting in Virtue of Another”, can then begin.

The water of baptism is supposed to confer divine grace on the baptized. But how is it possible, when the effect, which is spiritual and supernatural, exceeds in every way the nature of the cause, which is material and natural? In chapter 4, Ehret shows that the sacrament does not really act by virtue of a physical movement (as the stick or the axe do): it has none. Rather, Aquinas’s analysis in his commentary on the Sentences (In Sent. IV 1.1.4) is that the principal agent (God in the case of the sacrament) imparts to the instrument a power that exceeds its nature. Still, Aquinas uses the terminology of the moved mover, and declares that the power of the instrument is proportionate to its motion, which is described as an incomplete being (ens incompletum), a way towards being (via in ens), and as a certain medium (medium quid) between power and act. Ehret goes deep into the analysis of those terms, using mainly Averroes’s commentary on the Physics, to show that the incomplete being of the instrument’s motion is due to the succession of its constituent parts, of which only the present one is real (Averroes and Aquinas’s presentism). It is no more the imperfect realization of the terminal act that is at stake. The same notion of an ens incompletum can apply to the power of the sacrament but not with the same ground since its effect is instantaneous and requires no change: flowing from the agent, in which it has a complete and natural existence, the power has outside the agent only an incomplete existence, comparable to the intentional existence (esse intentionale) of the sensible species or appearances that flow from the material object into the medium and then into the organ (the characteristic of a form endowed with an intentional being is that it does not inform the subject that receives it, it is a case of “inherence without information”).

Chapter 5 extends this conclusion to the instrument in general: what makes the instrument effective is thus not its motion (the fishing net is not moving), but the fact that it acts in virtue of another, that is, with the power received from the principal agent. The analysis seems to violate the prohibition that an accident cannot be transferred from one subject to another (accidens non transit de subiecto in subiectum). Nonetheless this prohibition applies only to accidents that would exist within the same mode in both subjects, but it is not in the same mode that the power exists in the principal agent and in the instrument, nor in its effect. The being of the power in the instrument is a being in transit (esse transiens), flowing (fluens), and this is compatible with its numerical identity in the instrument and in its source. Ehret proposes to combine this achievement of the Summa theologiae (ST III.62.3) with the thesis of the commentary on the Sentences on the intentional being of the power. He can thus attribute to Aquinas a general conception of the virtus fluens as an intentio fluens. To show that the model is not ad hoc, reserved to the sacraments, but finds other illustrations and is valid in a general way, he resorts to the example of the sensible species, which flows from its source (the object) without being numerically distinct from it: it has an intentional being in the medium and then in the organ, and depends in its existence on the natural being that the form of which it is the appearance possesses in the source (like the color in the object). This is different from the intellectual species (the concept) which does not flow: it is an intentio quiescens, which can remain in the absence of its source. Ehret has here a very compelling discussion about the individuation of both kinds of species. This example no longer merely provides a comparison with the power of the sacrament, but is another special case of the general model of the flux of the power.

The last chapter (6) takes a further step in extending the theory to the causal powers themselves. Powers are like instruments that flow from the form of the agent, and that can exist in a material subject (which can thus receive an intentio without being informed by it). The thesis is valid both for the elements (their active and passive qualities flow from their form) and for the human soul (cf. ST I.77.6). The latter, and more generally the substantial form, is in a sense inactive, even if it is to the agent that one attributes the action and its result. We then end up with a paradox: is it through another instrument that the soul uses its powers (leading to a regress)? or should we finally consider it itself as a power? Rather than abandoning the distinction of the form and its powers and treating the form (the soul) as a principal power present in the secondary powers (which corresponds to certain expressions of Aquinas), the discussion leads Ehret to a weakened form of the instrumentality of the power: it depends on the form as to its existence and its conservation, but not as to its application. The dependence on its source makes the power traceable to its subject and, being “transparent”, the power lets us see the essence of its subject. Socrates is not rational because he has the power to reason, but the other way around: he has this power because he has a rational nature. The chapter and the book end, as a final test for Ehret’s whole interpretation, with a remarkable analysis of a passage (ST I.77.6 ad 3) comparing the way powers flow from the soul to the way color flows from light (ut ex luce color).

The conclusion devotes four pages (213–216) to a rather precise situation of Aquinas's conception of causal powers on the conceptual map offered by contemporary philosophy of dispositions or causal powers. Any power has a categorical basis (the nature of the substance) and cannot be distinguished from it as another property. Aquinas would thus support a monism of properties, but adopt the two-sided view (C.B. Martin), because the emanation of a power in an intentional being is sufficiently robust not to be entirely reduced to its basis. But if Socrates's rational power flows from his rational nature, what is this nature independently of the power that manifests it? To this crux of any theory of dispositions, Ehret thinks he can find a definitive answer in the conception of the degrees of being in Aquinas’s metaphysics: the contraction of the act of being according to this or that intensity, depending on the greater or lesser distance from subsistent being or from the creator, is the basis of the distinction of natures which in turn ground the powers.

This broad summary shows, I hope, the interest, breadth and coherence of Ehret's thesis. But it cannot do justice to the often very ingenious textual studies that allow the author to defend his reading, and add many interesting corollaries. The book is full of those and they should be appreciated and discussed for their own sake, as well as in order to check the main thesis. Ehret relies at length on some texts (In Phys. Lib III 1–2; Lib. VIII 4–5; In Sent. IV d.1, q.1, a.4; ST III, q.62, a.3; ST I, q.77, a.6) and uses many others (of Thomas but also of Aristotle, Averroes, even Simplicius or Albert) to build his interpretations. Many of them are indisputable, but some are very speculative and rest on a narrow textual basis (even if he always finds the help of a precise text to support his reading). Since they are most often very intricate, I cannot reproduce and even less discuss any of them here. This work must be left to others. I will content myself with three more general remarks.

The first concerns Ehret’s lack of consideration of the reasons which lead Thomas to hold the two analyses (moved mover-flowing power) together, explaining one by the other, when he examines the action of the sacrament. Ehret is certainly right to insist on the differences between, on the one hand, physical motion which imposes the succession of actual states determined by a fixed form, such that the moved body cannot be a mover at the same time and in the same respect, and, on the other hand, action by virtue of another which is metaphysically explained by the flow of power from the principal agent into the secondary agent, the instrument, in a particular mode. But Thomas precisely thinks of the instrument as a moved mover: the instrument is moved by the principal agent and moves, by this very fact, its object (the stick moved by the hand moves the stone by this very fact; the sacrament moved by God who gives it its power moves the soul by this very fact). Wouldn't it be necessary, then, to distinguish a metaphysical notion of motion (without succession, without change of the mobile, without stages distinct from the final effect) from physical motion, which would allow without contradiction for a moved mover and for the essential (per se) subordination of the movers? The paradox already pointed out would be avoided by the difference of the power’s mode of being in the primary agent and in the secondary agent, so that it would not be “in the same respect” that the mover would be moved and moving. I suppose Ehret could accept this reading, but would argue that it is a verbal difference with the one he is studying. By radicalizing the opposition, he introduces a difference where Thomas did not, and claims to make explicit what was implicitly present. This captures the reader’s attention, but it is not clear that this is the best way to draw the distinction.

The second remark concerns the status of the comparison between the power and the sensible species which gives rise to the idea of an intentional being of the power. The text of the Sentences only proposes an analogy. As we have seen, the ST no longer speaks of this intentional being, and the author offers us a construction from the two sources. He explains this in the conclusion (212): the analogy is not the object of a prolonged elucidation and it is up to the interpreter to understand how a power can have such a mode of being, usually limited to representations. The main motivation comes from Thomas's assertions that powers flow from the form, which he particularly studies in the case of the human soul. And it is another analogy with the flow of colors that allows him to equate the virtus fluens with the intentio fluens, and to understand that since powers flow from the form, this flow can be extended to the instrument. But then, even if sound, this reading is more than interpretation, it is a philosophical construction on the grounds offered by the analogy. We may applaud the construction and remain doubtful about the interpretation.

The third remark concerns the way the author treats his subject. I have pointed out that the putting into perspective of Thomas's position with the contemporary discussion is reduced to the essential. The author does not engage in the philosophical debate, he works as a scholar more than as a philosopher. But he pays much attention to the arguments of his authors and elaborates quite a few of his own, always very clearly, to justify his interpretations. Readers of the analytical tradition should therefore find themselves in familiar company. They should agree that, for the needs of Ehret’s interpretation, his great philological concern and erudition were necessary. But they might be disturbed by characteristics of a continental way of approaching the history of philosophy. Directly or indirectly, in particular under the influence of Alain de Libera's work, Ehret bears the mark of Foucault's country, and of the philosophy of suspicion. He writes of “strategies”, of “underground problems” that cross the texts below the knowledge of their authors, of “unthoughts” that one needs to reveal, of a “grey ontology” of the instrument (16, expression of JL Marion applied to Descartes, to designate an ontology that does not confess clearly its principles because it is not sufficiently self-aware). These continental habits should not distract readers trained in a more analytical way of practicing the history of philosophy: they are present only sporadically and one should agree that they are often relevant. In any case, the whole book gives credit to an approach to texts and arguments that can see beyond what their authors actually said.

Ehret’s whole study should be controversial, both for its general thesis and for several of its particular (instrumental) theses and arguments, which raise a great many interpretative challenges. In any case, it seems to me to be a must-read for anyone interested, on both sides of the Atlantic, in the thought of Thomas Aquinas, in medieval metaphysics, and more generally in the philosophy of the Aristotelian tradition on causal powers. For all three fields, this is an exceptional contribution.


I wish to thank Tobias Hoffmann and Michael Murez for their attentive reading and good suggestions on this text