Aiming at Virtue in Plato

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Iakovos Vasiliou, Aiming at Virtue in Plato, Cambridge UP, 2008, 311pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521862967.

Reviewed by David Ebrey, Northwestern University



In Aiming at Virtue in Plato, Iakovos Vasiliou presents an alternative to readings of Plato’s early and middle dialogues that work within a eudaimonist framework. On such readings, Plato thinks that all of our actions are for the sake of happiness. Vasiliou does not argue against such a view; instead, his goal is simply to present a different picture that better captures what is central to Plato’s ethical project. According to Vasiliou, we are better served by seeing Plato as driven by two complementary questions: on the one hand aiming questions — questions of the supreme aim of our actions — and on the other, determining questions — questions of how to go about achieving this aim. Vasiliou thinks that Socrates is committed to the supremacy of virtue (SV) as an answer to the aiming question, but does not have an answer to the corresponding determining question: how to act virtuously.

This distinction between aiming questions and determining questions is the central idea of the book. Vasiliou engages with an impressively wide range of textual disputes, frequently arguing that they can be resolved by being clear on which question Socrates is focused on answering. But Vasiliou’s main focus is on helping us make sense of whole dialogues through the lens of the aiming/determining distinction. He examines many so-called early and middle dialogues (Vasiliou stays neutral on issues of chronology) and treats most of them as focused either on arguing for SV or on answering a determining question. There are substantial discussions of the Crito and Euthyphro, which he treats as primarily about determining questions, and of the Gorgias and the Republic, which he treats as primarily attempts to argue for SV (although he thinks determining questions play an important secondary role in the Republic). The Apology is the one dialogue in which he gives fairly equal weight to SV and determining questions.

Vasiliou sees Socrates as driven to act virtuously, but ignorant of what virtue is and so (except when his divine sign intervenes) ignorant of what to do. While I think few would disagree with this basic account, Vasiliou rightly gives it central stage in his account of Socratic ethics. There are, however, some more controversial details of how he understands the aiming/determining distinction. First, he treats SV as a substantive claim. This is, at least, contentious; perhaps it is supposed to be trivially true that everyone should be virtuous. One way this could be the case is if Socrates thought that virtue is valuable simply because it provides us with benefit (as is suggested in both the Euthydemus and the Meno). Assuming that benefit is always worth pursuing, then virtue would be too; indeed, as the route to benefit, virtue would be the most important thing for us to acquire. Vasiliou, however, does not take this thin sort of reading; instead, he thinks it is a substantive, controversial claim that we should aim at virtue. At the same time, he thinks that Socrates avows knowledge of what to aim at (i.e., SV), but disavows knowledge of “what is virtue?” — which would be needed to know the answer to determining questions. (Vasiliou thinks that Socrates has beliefs but not knowledge about what actions are virtuous.) I agree with Vasiliou that Socrates avows SV and disavows knowledge of what virtue is, but if true it should increase our expectations that SV is a thin claim rather than a substantive one. If SV were a trivially true claim, we could understand why Socrates claims to know SV and still claim to be ignorant — it could be a type of knowledge that is thin enough that you can have it and still reasonably claim to be ignorant. In fact, it is a bit hard to see how Vasiliou himself is not committed to some sort of thin reading of virtue. He frequently urges the readers to not take a “moralizing” reading of Socrates on which we understand his commitment to virtue as a commitment to an answer to determining questions. Socrates is committed to virtue, but he does not presume that he knows best what to do in a given situation. If Socrates does not prejudge what virtue is, what is he substantively claiming when he says we should aim at it?

Vasiliou also thinks that first and foremost Socrates aims at virtuous actions, not being virtuous. This becomes very important to his analysis of the Republic. I am not convinced by his account. First, in Greek one cannot turn “virtue” into an adjective like “virtuous” or an adverb like “virtuously” — the closest you can come is a “good action” or a “just action”, “acting well” or “acting justly”. So Plato does not use a term like “virtuous action.” Of course, Plato might be focused on “virtuous actions” even if he had no such term — but it seems a bit strange to me to suppose that Plato made it our fundamental aim. The evidence seems to me to point towards Plato not consistently showing a preference for virtue in action, virtue in people, or virtue in our souls. Why is Vasiliou committed to Socrates’ focus being on actions? Ultimately, it seems to be because he thinks that Socrates is driven by a basic question: what should we do, i.e., how should we act? Vasiliou thinks that Socrates’ answer is: as virtue dictates. While I think Vasiliou is right that Socrates is, in general, interested in a practical question of how to go about living our lives (as I would put it), I am not convinced that Plato meant his goal to be strictly understood in terms of our actions being virtuous as opposed to us or our souls being virtuous.

Now that we have seen some of the important features of SV, let us turn to how Vasiliou thinks Socrates argues for SV: (1) the soul is an independent locus of harm and benefit (like the body); (2) benefit to our soul is much more worthwhile than that to our body; (3) virtuous actions benefit our soul by making it virtuous; therefore, SV: we must aim to act virtuously. In a number of dialogues, Vasiliou sees Socrates as arguing for or defending premises of this argument. The argument ultimately grounds the value of virtuous actions in the benefit they provide to our souls. Nevertheless benefiting the soul is not our ultimate goal — acting virtuously is. So virtuous action is done for its own sake, but its value comes from the benefit it provides to our souls.

The first two dialogues Vasiliou discusses are the Apology and Crito. He thinks that these are dialogues in which Socrates is focused on answering determining questions in the here and now. In most dialogues Socrates can proceed at leisure; however, in these he must act on short notice, despite not knowing what virtue is. I think Vasiliou is right that the Crito and Apology focus on decisions in the here and now. However, this is true of other dialogues as well. After all, we decide whether to engage in conversation or not and, for Socrates, the unexamined life is not worth living. In a dialogue like the Laches, Socrates spends considerable energy convincing people that here and now they should search for an answer to a “what is it?” question. So, if anything, I would say that Vasiliou does not go far enough in emphasizing that Socrates makes ethical decisions in the here and now.

Vasiliou argues that Socrates’ position in the Apology is more plausible once we appreciate the aiming/determining distinction. When one first reads the Apology, Socrates seems to be saying that we should only pay attention to virtue, not at all to our lives, our property, or anything else. According to Vasiliou, Socrates’ position is that we should only aim at virtue, not these other things; however, we can and should pay attention to the other things when we try to determine what the virtuous thing to do is. Socrates is critiquing people’s aims; he is not saying that one should ignore money or death. I find Vasiliou’s reading plausible, but it does require that we not take a surface reading of lines like this:

You are not right, sir, if you think that a man who is worth even some little bit ought to take under consideration the risk of living or dying and not instead look to this alone when he acts: whether he is doing just or unjust things, the deeds of a good or a bad man (28b6-c1, trans. Vasiliou p. 24).

Socrates here does not simply tell us to look only at whether something is just; he positively tells us not to take under consideration the risk of living or dying. Vasiliou has to understand this as meaning that we should not take it under consideration as an aim — but we can take it under consideration in determining what is just.

How does Socrates make decisions about what is virtuous in the here and now? Vasiliou thinks that Socrates is led either by his divine sign or by the argument that seems best to him at the time. What goes into such arguments? Vasiliou is not always clear how such arguments would work. For example, he says that Socrates mentions his age at least ten times in the Apology and then concludes that Socrates intends the jury to take this into account in determining what the just thing to do is. Nevertheless it is not clear how Socrates’ age could fit into an argument that would seem best.

Vasiliou’s account of the Crito seems to me to be more successful. He focuses on three major phases of the dialogue: Crito’s argument that remaining is shameful and unjust; Socrates’ argument for SV; and the laws’ argument, which tells us what seems best to Socrates. Vasiliou here deftly navigates the secondary literature, arguing against interpretations that see a conflict between the laws’ account and Socrates’ remarks in his own voice. The bulk of the laws’ speech is divided into two parts: first, Socrates would be doing an injustice if he escaped and second, contra-Crito, he would not be doing an injustice if he stayed. He sees the whole speech as a cumulative effort, no one part of which is meant to be an unassailable argument; instead, it incorporates a number of considerations in favor of his staying. For example, he argues that the parent-child, master-slave analogy is meant to tell us that a subordinate can be expected to suffer something (in this case, destruction) that the superior should not suffer — especially when the superior is aiming to act virtuously. Vasiliou does not think this is meant to be a fully satisfying argument on its own, but to be a reasonable consideration in favor of staying.

Vasiliou’s discussion of the Gorgias is at least as detailed as his discussion of the Apology or Crito and an important contribution to the scholarship on the dialogue. I will say just a few words about it to make room for his discussion of the Republic, which takes up more than a hundred pages of the book. The basic idea is that Gorgias, Polus, and Callicles each have different attitudes towards SV because of their different attitudes towards the argument for SV. Once it is brought to his attention, Gorgias agrees to SV, although it is not clear how firmly he is committed is to it. Socrates has to convince Polus and Callicles of SV. Polus does not see the soul as an independent locus of harm and benefit and so is not convinced of the premise (1) of Socrates’ argument. Callicles, on the other hand, agrees that there are things good for the soul (namely, appetite gratification), but denies that these include acting virtuously, contra premise (3).

Vasiliou’s discussion of the Republic is ambitious and complex. He wants to argue against the prevalent idea that the Republic abandons an act-centered account of virtue in favor of an agent-centered one. At the same time, he presents a case that Socrates argues for SV in Republic I-IV, VIII-IX, and tells us who could answer determining questions in Republic V-VII. Along the way, Vasiliou engages with dozens of relevant controversies.

According to Vasiliou, the basic strategy of the Republic is to defend SV by showing that acting virtuously benefits us by benefitting the soul. He argues that in the Republic Socrates gives a sophisticated defense of the basic three-premise argument for SV mentioned above. In particular, by making justice a type of health for the soul, he explains how (1) our soul can be harmed or benefited. Perhaps the more innovative idea is to focus on the education of the guardians in books II and III as illustrating how (3) acting virtuously benefits our soul. Vasiliou sees these two books as explaining a habituation principle (virtuous actions make us virtuous) that is crucial for Socrates’ argument for SV. By doing so, Vasiliou makes these books much more central to the overall argument of the Republic than they are generally taken to be. It is an interesting idea, but ultimately I am left unconvinced that Socrates actually expected us to draw the connections that Vasiliou does. If he does not, then we cannot see the Republic as attempting to defend SV in the way that Vasiliou presents.

Vasiliou argues that we should understand what happens in Republic IV in light of this project of defending SV. Scholars often think that Socrates is moving to an agent-centered account of virtue in book IV. Vasiliou argues, instead, that Socrates is not really giving us an account of virtue in book IV; instead, he is more narrowly providing us with what is needed for his defense of SV. Socrates is not telling us “what justice is” when he gives his harmony account in book IV; instead, he is telling us, in Vasiliou’s terminology, “what it is to be just”, which tells us which are the just souls without telling us which are the just actions. Once we learn what it is to be just, we can see how it is a sort of health of the soul and so why people are benefited when they become just.

As it is initially presented, I do not think Vasiliou’s account is compelling for those not antecedently convinced that Socrates is focused on just actions throughout the Republic. However, his account gains appeal during his discussion of the philosophers in V-VII. Vasiliou raises a sort of puzzle. The true philosophers have knowledge of forms — in particular the form of the good and of justice — and because they have this knowledge, they know how to determine which are the just acts. Clearly Socrates’ account of justice in book IV would not be enough to guide them to just action. Thus, somehow, what the philosophers have when they know the form of justice cannot be the same as what Socrates proposes in book IV. Vasiliou’s two types of “what is it?” questions resolve this puzzle; the forms that the philosophers have in V-VII tell them what the virtuous actions are, whereas Socrates account in book IV simply tells us what it is for a soul to be virtuous. I do not think that Vasiliou is correct; however, his account does have explanatory value internal to the Republic and raises an important puzzle all commentators will want to consider.

Aiming at Virtue in Plato is an ambitious and controversial book. Most scholars who work through it will find a number of points of disagreement; however, I think one learns much more from this type of book than from a more conservative one. Some people will be drawn to the book because of its treatment of the Apology, Crito, Gorgias, Euthyphro, or Republic; they will want to at least read the introduction along with the corresponding chapters. Whether you come to the book with such a purpose or not, you will be drawn in by one of its real strengths: it carefully works through details while staying focused on important big-picture questions about Platonic ethics. On some of these big-picture questions, I think Vasiliou is fundamentally right.