Aims: A Brief Metaphysics for Today

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James W. Felt, Aims: A Brief Metaphysics for Today, University of Notre Dame Press, 2007, 148pp., $20.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780268029012.

Reviewed by Oliva Blanchette, Boston College


This is a very engaging exploration into a philosophical terrain where few nowadays care to venture, one that has been subjected to much deconstruction in recent times. It is a terrain difficult to penetrate rationally, as Plato and Aristotle were the first to recognize, when they first dared to venture into what appeared to them a domain reserved for the gods.

The exploration is engaging because it starts from today, phenomenologically in human experience, and dares to raise questions that systematically take us beyond the immediacy of what is given in our experience of the world, into a realm of first principles and final ends that somehow surpass the intelligibility of this experience. Another thing that makes it engaging for both teachers and students of metaphysics is that it proceeds systematically, through principles (the only way of entering into this realm of investigation), and expeditiously, through a forward looking teleology built into human experience as a feeling that is found in any human consciousness.

At "the very core of teleology, the recognition of the role of final causality", as Felt puts it, there is an inbuilt attraction for an end that can serve as the starting point "for a fundamental ontology such as we are attempting here. That is why I have ventured to name this book simply Aims" (76). Teleology is an underlying pattern that shapes "the basic structure of human experience." Teleology is also thought to reflect "the most fundamental structure of all natural activity" (3), the dynamic structure thought to run through the entire cosmic process in its evolution toward some kind of fulfillment, whether in the rational self-consciousness itself or in some other entity that gives this finite entity, in its essential character as a primary being, its essential aim.

Human experience is thus taken as the paradigm for understanding the metaphysical structure of teleology, not just in human experience itself, but also in the world of extra mental objects as well. Human experience is where this reflective metaphysical teleology begins, where we get "the feeling of value or worth, good or bad" (11), in the world constituted as a whole. This feeling of worth or of aim "forms part of the original experience" (11), no less than the extra mental objects that affect us in our consciousness. The feeling is there in the way we experience our subjectivity at the same time as we experience extra mental objects, "in the act of a subject (of experiencing) involved with an objective world" (12). The task of a metaphysical teleology is to inquire into the origin of the feeling of aim at the heart of human experience, and into the fundamental ontological principles that can account for it.

First among the principles Felt lays down for this inquiry is the one he speaks of as the act of existing, which is not a thing or a quality or a form, which cannot be captured in a concept, but which is the root of all intelligibility. In this principle there are three modes to be distinguished, "the act itself of existing (esse), the act of coming into being (fieri) of a substance or primary being, and the consequent activity (agere) that flows from the act of existing" (21). These three modes can clearly be distinguished in human experience, but the most important one for a teleological metaphysics is the third, that of the consequent activity, where a primary being such as the human subject is seen as essentially active, or as existing by real-izing or actualizing itself, starting from a built-in teleology proper to itself as a substance or as a primary being.

A second principle adds an intersubjective or interactive dimension to this first one, in that every primary being as active or as existing is seen as influencing other primary beings in the world. It is a presencing that bespeaks "both the dynamism of self-fulfillment and making a difference to others" (ibid).

The third principle is one of inner polarity between potency (or possibility) and act in the third mode of existing as consequent activity in self-fulfillment of a primary being that has come to be. "All possibility for further existing, [i.e., agere], must reside in what is already actual" (22). This "ontological principle" Felt finds explicitly in Leibniz and Whitehead, derived from the principle of sufficient reason as distinct from the principle of non-contradiction or mere possibility. Felt accepts this principle only as a one of inner polarity within the primary being that has come to be, as a possibility that remains in something already actual, as an inner dynamic that runs through all things that have come to be and that have to act or to exist in order to real-ize themselves in accordance with their final aim, regardless of whether or not their coming to be in act was influenced by another thing.

The fourth principle, of an extrinsic causal impact from other things in the world, is brought in as as something intrinsic to our sense experience as part of feeling affected by extra-mental objects in the ongoing flow of experience from past through present to future. This principle of extrinsic efficient causality will be crucial when it comes to giving an account of the origin of essential aims.

All of the foregoing principles can be understood most readily with reference to the conscious primary being in human experience, where teleology is most clearly at work at the level of consequent activity, in the third mode of existing. However, in order to extend this teleological perspective to all things in the world, conscious or not, Felt adds further principles to show that "all basic activities within nature are goal-directed" (22), and not just purely mechanistic. Even at the level of merely natural processes, he claims, "ideals for future realization are in some way experientially felt" (23), though not consciously so. This follows from thinking of human experience as an outgrowth of the evolutionary process of the universe. Given what we find in the end, which is where we begin with our teleological perspective, we have to project the teleological perspective back into the entire process leading up to the very consciousness of "a basic experiential dynamism of cosmic process" (23).

Mere mechanism or deterministic efficient causality cannot account for the universe as we experience it, or as it experiences itself. Nature itself has to be understood in terms of final causality, where teleology "forms an essential fabric of a whole metaphysical perspective" (24). This is not to say that the causal attraction of an essential aim has no ontological consequences in the primary beings that have come to be. Causal attraction of an aim has to be seen as a value for the being that feels the aim as an unrealized probability. This can clearly be said of particular aims that a conscious being may have other than its essential aim, but it is most true of the essential aim of any particular primary being that cannot give itself its essential aim, even though it may be able to give itself, or feel, particular aims in its second act of existing or its consequent free activity.

Treatment of particular aims for the self-conscious being as they relate to its essential aim is a matter for ethical reflection rather than for properly metaphysical consideration even in a teleological perspective. Metaphysical teleology has to do only with the essential aim of subjects and of extra-mental objects in the world, and with what may be the origin of this entire process in a first cause (an alpha).

Felt recognizes that he is extrapolating his teleological perspective from human experience to some sort of experience for the cosmos as a whole, but he sees this not as mere anthropomorphism but rather as a necessary condition for extending a teleological perspective, known first from the side of the self-conscious subject, to the entire object of experience, including other subjects as well as lesser primary beings or natures without consciousness in the cosmic experience.

With all these principles in mind, using the experiencing subject itself as a prototype or as a primary analogate for "the basic structure of every existent in nature" (30), Felt then proceeds to argue for the unity of an essential character that runs through the experience of any subject, past, present and future, a "character" that "filters the act of existing to be just this or that sort" (32), much as the form or the essence of a primary being determines the consequent activity that flows from it in a way that is a "particular, definite, and hence limited capacity for existing in a certain way" (ibid).

This essential character is then said to derive ontologically from its essential aim, or from its final cause, which defines its essential human character and orients it toward its own fulfillment, rather than from any causal impact that may have influenced its coming to be as a substance or as a primary with this limited capacity for existing in a certain way. The question then becomes, not whether some essential character could be the cause of its coming to be, but rather whether an essential character can give itself its own essential aim. Felt will discuss this question at some length in later chapters, but he can already give a short negative answer; namely, that one cannot be oneself the source of one's essential aim without the circularity of producing "by my own activity a principle that is a necessary condition for my being or acting at all" (33).

In the final metaphysical thrust of his argument, Felt presents the essential character of primary beings in human experience as lured by an essential aim "similar to Whitehead's subjective -- or initial -- aim" (62). The essential aim "furnishes for the primary being its own ideal of self-fulfillment in existing and experiencing," but this ideal is seen not "so much [as] an essence to be achieved [but rather as] a vector toward fullness of esse in the being's determinate capacity for acting" (62). Experiencing in this sense entails, not just a form of definiteness coming from the past, but also a feeling of "the form of what, given the situation, could be but is not yet … a feeling of an unrealized, determinate possibility for the future … a feeling of aim" (63-64). We should note in passing how the feeling of an unrealized possibility is still said to be determinate, and ask what is the origin of this determinateness in the seemingly indeterminate vector toward a fullness of esse.

Determinate primary beings of the human kind are thus to be understood as reacting to the universe in an original way, more or less creatively, so that two kinds of "attractive possibilities for what is not yet" come into view, one particular as a response to a given situation, and the other as an overriding or essential possibility for complete self-fulfillment. It is in virtue of the attraction of its overriding essential aim that the primary being is seen as able "to contrive or invent particular patterns of possibilities, the pursuit of which would presumably contribute toward the achievement of its self-ideal or essential aim" (65-66). Something analogous to this is postulated for all primary beings in the cosmos, those without as well as those with self-conscious freedom. But the idea of "substance" for such primary beings is rejected, just as the reality of a substantial form as principle of its own self-fulfilling activity is left out of consideration, to make way only for an essential aim that seems to float into consciousness as a feeling for something that is not, but could be. It is as if the determinate unity of the complex primary being itself were purely teleological (68) and not actually experienced as substantial or as real by the primary being in its essential character.

This is the extreme position that follows from "Whitehead's conception of reality in terms of metaphysical event-atoms, his actual entities or occasions of experience" (67). Felt does not go along with that conception of event-atoms or actual occasions entirely, but in the absence of any serious consideration of the substantial form as the end of the process of primary beings coming into being, such as we find in Aristotle and Aquinas, he finds it difficult to give any reason for taking exception to the Whiteheadian view of the essential aim. It is as if the essential aim were detached from any primary being such as the one Felt has been presupposing from his very first ontological principle of an act of existing in three modes, when he speaks of "the act of coming into being (fieri) of a substance or a primary being" as the second mode.

In the end, then, when the question concerning the cause of an essential or a defining aim for a primary being and its essential character surfaces, Felt thinks only of the essential aim and not of how the primary being is constituted through coming to be in its essential character. Participation in existing is understood only in relation to "existing" taken as consequent activity for a primary being that has come to be, not in relation to form as the act of this composite that has come to be, much less in relation to esse as an act received in a determinate essence or character that has come to be through an inner polarity of potency and act, as understood by Aristotelians such as Aquinas. The created primary being is not seen as something in itself with an identity of its own, an essence or a substantial form from which self-actualizing activity follows, but only as a return to its source according to an aim in which there is no experience of potency and no real feeling. To be sure, in a systematic teleological perspective, participation does imply a return of the created primary being to its source through its consequent activity. But the question remains as to whether there is any source to return to other than the essential aim itself of self-fulfillment, an external cause that is both effective of the essential character, so that it can have its own consequent activity, and attractive for this character as essential aim for its self-fulfillment.

Felt tries to close the gap in his argument about the origin of essential aims by proposing a cosmological argument for God (or for Alpha, as he prefers to say) in a discourse that purports to be metaphysical and not religious. He refers generally to the Five Ways of Aquinas, but only to focus on the Fourth Way, based on the perception of different degrees of perfection or goodness in being, and not on the Fifth Way, which is the more properly teleological of the Five Ways. He falls back on the Whiteheadian "ontological principle" elaborated earlier at the beginning of this metaphysical inquiry as a way of entering into the question. He quotes Whitehead as follows: "According to the ontological principle there is nothing which floats into the world from nowhere. Everything in the actual world is referable to some actual entity," which he says is "Whitehead's technical term for an ultimate existent, what I call a primary being" (79). From this he concludes to a supposition that "something (or other) has always existed" (ibid), or to some necessary being, much as Aquinas does in the Third Way, before raising the further question of whether this necessary being is uncaused or not.

The question raised in the Five Ways or in other cosmological arguments for the existence of an Alpha is whether there is an uncaused cause that is the essential aim of the universe or of primary beings in it, not just one that is first and necessary within the cosmos, an uncaused cause, without potency of any kind whatsoever, and for which the question of "sufficient reason for existing" does not even arise. As uncaused cause, Alpha has to be thought of simply as pure act, without any potency whatsoever and without any inner polarity of potency to act, such as we find in the primary beings of experience.

Felt devotes a chapter to "the problem of the origin of essential aims" as they pertain to what he calls primary beings in experience, which are not reducible to what Whitehead calls actual entities or actual occasions. He frames the question in terms of the ultimate principle that defines a primary being in its essential aim with reference, not to the consequent activity of the primary being in experience, but to the very act of existing in its first mode or as esse of a determinate essence. He continues "to assume the theory of the participated character of the act of existing from a single source of that existing, which I have called Alpha" (85), but he offers no explanation for that assumption as conceived, or for the participated character of the act existing as felt or as received in a determinate form. He sees the theory only as leading to the question "whether Alpha is itself the origin of every essential aim" (85). Alpha is simply taken for granted as "the source of the very coming into existence of the primary being whose act of existing is limited to a determinate manner of existing" (85). Presumably, the determinateness of the primary being's determinate essential aim will follow from that, in its determinate manner of existing as active. The only question we have to ask is: "To what can we attribute this determinateness?" (ibid), since "so to impart to each nascent being its very act of being is ipso facto also to give it its essential aim" (86), irrespective of the determinate character of the nascent being.

Consequently, in Felt's view, we then have to think of Alpha itself as entertaining within itself all the possibles according to some matrix imbedded in the universe of primary beings as we know them, "an unlimited conceptual realization of the absolute wealth of potentiality," to quote Whitehead again (86), including the potentialities of free agents as well as those of mere nature. What we come to in this reverse ontological argument, going from the supposed Creator to an existing creation, is what the author calls "Whitehead's extraordinary solution" (87) to the question of whether Alpha is the origin of every essential aim in its determinateness.

As the origin of all essential aims, albeit not of the immediate subjective aims of every primary being, Alpha supposedly experiences or feels the world-situation of every actual entity as it is about to come into being. As such it is now seen as having a "consequent nature", like any primary being in the universe, and as feeling the factuality of the whole world. Alpha is thus seen as having an experience of its own and, at every moment of this experience, it supposedly feels the causal impact of all past actual entities as they impinge upon the nascent entity. More surprisingly still, for one who thinks of Alpha as pure act without any potentiality whatsoever, Alpha is also said to feel, in its "primordial nature", all the available possibilities for value inherent in the nascent and self-actualizing primary beings. In its primordial nature as creator, Alpha is thus seen simply as "the total envisagement of all interrelated possibilities" (87), not as uncaused cause or as what is aimed at in essential aims, but as something like a primary being of experience that feels all essential aims. This follows from thinking of a teleological cosmology in which there is only a feeling or a potentiality for essential aims and no substantial primary beings that actually feel essential aims in a consequent self-actualizing activity of their own.

In the end Felt does not subscribe to this solution to the question of whether or how Alpha is the origin of all essential aims of every primary being or actual entity whose essential aim is somehow felt in the universe by the Alpha as well as by other primary beings or actual entities. But he is not satisfied with the Thomistic solution that makes more of the substantial form in primary beings as potencies, or as feelings for essential aims, because he thinks that such substantial forms in human subjects cannot be understood as coming to be as a result of evolutionary forces or potencies in nature. Higher forms in nature cannot be understood as derived from lower forms. What Felt opts for is a modified Whiteheadian solution, where an Alpha-type of special activity is required "only for the provision of novel or higher-order essential aims, but not for repeating already existent sorts of aims, such as occur in animal or plant generation" (95). This amounts to a sort of occasionalism concerning the procreation of higher-order primary beings such as humans, where the essential aim and the essential character is supposedly felt as caused only by some Alpha in immediate experience and in Alpha's very feelings for it as part of the process, as if parents or other primary beings in the cosmic order had nothing to do with the procreation of higher-order forms with their own essential aims.

Reverting back to his own first principle concerning the three modes of existing as esse, fieri, and agere, Felt differentiates himself from Whitehead, not by insisting on what he refers to as an essential character in which an essential aim is felt in primary beings of experience, but rather by focusing on the essential aim only as an attraction toward a "particular way of existing in which it would be most existentially enriched. Such an attraction is a way of receiving participated existing and forms a necessary aspect of Alpha's furnishing existence (esse) to the being" (101). One is left to wonder whether Alpha is really the source of an essential aim or of agere as such, or whether it is not rather the source of the essential character itself in its substantial form, from which the essential aim flows as consequent activity. The second alternative seems necessary to avoid the charge of occasionalism on this score as well as on the score of the procreation of novel higher-order primary beings, in the absence of any due consideration of the substantial form that comes to be in a process of generation as the principle of its own consequent self-actualizing activity.

Felt recognizes objections to his modified Whiteheadian solution that are akin to the charge of occasionalism intimated here, including the more important one, leveled by W. Norris Clarke, of denying the primary beings of nature their proper consequent activities. Clarke's objection also amounts to a charge of occasionalism, since the point is that actual entities become only occasions for Alpha's interventions in a process otherwise conceived as natural only in a statistical sense, with all sorts of failures in evidence in the sequence of natural events from which higher essential forms are seen to emerge. In an evolutionary teleological perspective one has to discount these failures as aberrations in a mechanical determinism lacking any feeling for aims of any kind. One has simply to accept the processes of nature, including the emergence of new primary beings as participating "in Alpha's aims as well as in Alpha's effective power" (113).

Whether such a solution to the question of essential aims for primary beings in the universe is acceptable from a systematic metaphysical standpoint is for the reader to judge. In the mind of this reader, it is not. First, the solution does not recognize any teleology in the process of coming to be as such for primary beings that would have to do immediately with a feeling for form as essential character or as determination for that being. Second, the solution ultimately reduces the final causality of God's aim in creating in to some sort of efficient causality (intelligent design) that does not fit the universe as we know it ontologically--that is, as made up of a wide diversity of primary beings each with an activity of their own--and as we feel it teleologically with a wide diversity of essential aims toward other primary beings, all coalescing together into the perfection of a single universe under the universal impact and attraction of a single universal Alpha and Omega.

In a final effort to bolster his solution to the question of the origin of essential aims, Felt brings the discussion back to a consideration of immediate human experience, where the idea of an overarching essential aim makes some sense as a substitute for substantial form with regard to personal identity. "I am one primary being because all my parts share in my single essential aim" (120). How they come to do so in the purposeful ethical behavior of the primary being, however, is never brought up in this teleological metaphysics that purports to be about all particular primary beings in the universe, but about no particular primary being with a form of its own as principle of its activity. In a concluding chapter, F simply reiterates his starting point in human experience as the question we have to start from in the elaboration of a teleological metaphysics based on one's feeling for an essential aim. As such, the exercise of this teleological metaphysics turns out to be an exercise in knowing oneself and knowing one's essential aim, which has to include a knowing and a feeling for Alpha as the source of every primary being's essential aim in the universe. What remains unclear is whether Alpha itself is really transcendent to the cosmos of essential aims it creates as first cause. Whether, that is, Alpha exists as uncaused cause and as pure act without any potentiality or inner polarity whatsoever, from within or from without, unlike any primary being such as the ones we know in experience with their three modes of existing in tension with one another by reason of a potentiality we feel as existing, as coming to be, and as active for the sake of self-fulfillment.

Even if we do not always agree with where Felt wants to take us in this onto-teleology, as we read the book we cannot help but get engaged in the unassuming and rigorous exploration that it presents as a result of a long life of reflecting and teaching this difficult subject. We should be thankful for the publication of such a good model for teaching metaphysics as we learn it and for learning metaphysics as we teach it.