Akrasia in Greek Philosophy: From Socrates to Plotinus

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Christopher Bobonich and Pierre Destrée (eds.), Akrasia in Greek Philosophy: From Socrates to Plotinus, Brill, 2007, 308pp., $167.00 (hbk), ISBN 9789004156708.

Reviewed by Susan Sauvé Meyer, University of Pennsylvania


An international group of scholars from Europe and the Americas explore in this volume the ancient discussion of the phenomenon known today as "weakness of will" but for which Aristotle's label is akrasia.  There are two loci classici of the Ancient discussion.  The first is Plato's Protagoras (352b-358d), where Socrates denies that there is any such thing as knowing what is wrong but doing it anyway because one is "overcome by pleasure"; alleged cases of this are in fact instances in which the agent mistakenly supposes that she is doing what is best.  The second is Aristotle's Nicomachean Ethics VII, where (especially in chapter 3) he defends a version of the Protagoras' position that the akratic agent acts in ignorance.

The phenomenon under discussion in these contexts is a reasonably familiar feature of human experience, which may be neutrally characterized (as the paper by Shields very helpfully does) as a kind of "implementation failure":  a person fails to do what she takes herself to have identified as the right thing to do, because of the attraction of available pleasures.  What Socrates in the Protagoras and Aristotle find problematic is not implementation failure per se, but rather the popular assumption that the agent in such cases knows (or even judges) that he is doing something wrong.  On the contrary, these philosophers insist, such an agent is ignorant of the wrongness of his action.  The implications of this analysis of akrasia for Plato's and Aristotle's moral psychology is hotly contested by contemporary scholars, and most of the papers in the volume (ten of the thirteen) address or relate to these disputes.  The remaining three papers discuss the treatment of akrasia in Stoicism and neo-Platonism.

The seven papers on Plato address, more or less directly, a popular interpretation of Plato's moral psychology according to which dialogues such as Protagoras, Laches and Charmides present Socrates as espousing a monistic intellectualist psychology:  an undivided psyche in which reason supplies the practical impulse.  This psychology is supposed to rule out the possibility of knowledge being overcome by passion or other non-rational impulses because it countenances no such impulses (or at any rate, no effective ones).  With the introduction of the divided soul in book IV of the Republic, however, and the possibility of conflicting psychological impulses that it entails, Plato rehabilitates (on this interpretation) the conception of akrasia rejected in the Protagoras.[1]

With their characteristic precision and clarity, Thomas Brickhouse and Nicholas Smith argue that in dialogues where the intellectualist psychology is alleged to be present, Socrates explicitly admits the existence of non-rational practical impulses capable of effectively determining action.  In "Socrates in Akrasia, Knowledge, and the Power of Appearance", they argue that such desires, if strong enough, are responsible for the distorting "power of appearance" that Socrates in the Protagoras cites as the cause of the akratic agent's ignorance.  On this interpretation, in contrast with the standard view, a divided soul is compatible with, and indeed part of the explanation of, the ignorance attributed by Socrates to the akratic.

Christopher Rowe, by contrast, defends an unusually strong version of the intellectualist interpretation for pre-Republic dialogues:  even in dialogues such as the Gorgias, which on the standard view are at least "transitional" to the pluralistic psychology of the Republic, the psychology affirmed by Socrates is thoroughly intellectualist.  In "A Problem in the Gorgias: How is Punishment Supposed to Help with Intellectual Error?", Rowe responds to the apparent anomaly for his thesis posed by Socrates' insistence in that dialogue on the moral efficacy of punishment and on the importance of self-mastery.

Christopher Bobonich too has no quarrel with the standard view that the intellectualist psychology of the Protagoras is replaced by a pluralistic one in the Republic and that Plato's position on akrasia alters accordingly.  His concern instead in "Plato on Akrasia and Knowing Your Own Mind" is to refine our understanding of that monistic psychology in order to better appreciate Plato's motivation for abandoning it.  What has hitherto gone unnoticed by commentators, he argues, is that in the psychology of the Protagoras agents are unaware of their own beliefs and desires.

The standard interpretation receives indirect but independent support from Louis-André Dorion in "Plato and Enkrateia".  'Enkrateia' in the relevant sense refers to self-control, and is the common antonym for 'akrasia'.  Even though enkrateia is prominent in the teachings of Socrates in Xenophon's Memorabilia, it is noticeably absent, Dorion points out, from Plato's version of Socratic philosophy in dialogues that (on the standard interpretation) are classified as "intellectualist" -- most strikingly from the Charmides, where it occurs nowhere among the canvassed definitions of sophrosunê (temperance, moderation) even though it was clearly one of the ordinary understandings of the notion.  It is only after Plato has endorsed a pluralistic psychology in dialogues such as Gorgias, Republic, and Laws, Dorion argues, that he invokes the notion of self-control in his account of virtue.

Among contributors who reject the standard interpretation of Plato's psychology, Christopher Shields in "Unified Agency in Plato's Republic" denies that there is any disagreement about akrasia between the Protagoras and the Republic.  In neither dialogue, he claims, does Socrates endorse the possibility of "implementation failure" by agents with highly unified psychologies -- a category that would include both the psychological hedonist of the Protagoras and the just person of the Republic.  Roslyn Weiss' dissent from the standard view, by contrast, focuses on the division between reason and appetite in Republic IV.  In "Thirst as Desire for Good", she rejects the view that at Republic 438a Plato introduces a kind of desire that is not directed at the good.  With the single exception of the Protagoras, she argues, Plato consistently presents all desire as good-dependent.

Since the standard interpretation takes the diagnosis of akrasia as ignorance to stand or fall with a monistic psychology, it faces the awkward problem that (a) this diagnosis is simply a special case of the famous Platonic principle that no one does wrong willingly and (b) this principle is explicitly invoked not only in the Protagoras, but also in dialogues, such as Timaeus and Laws, that advance a pluralistic psychology.  Gabriela Carone's essay, "Akrasia and the Structure of the Passions in Plato's Timaeus", confirms the compatibility of the tripartite psychology with the denial of voluntary wrongdoing.  Carone's detailed and scholarly discussion situates the Timaeus' tripartite psychology in the context of its distinctive account of the world soul, and argues that the non-rational parts of the soul have doxastic capacities.  This, she concludes, is what makes the pluralistic psychology compatible with the principle that all wrongdoing is involuntary.

Aristotle famously endorses both the diagnosis of akrasia as ignorance (in some sense) and a psychology that includes both rational and non-rational impulses.  This would seem to be additional evidence that the standard interpretation of Plato rests on a false dichotomy.  Alternatively, however, one might insist on the dichotomy, and as a result find Aristotle's position incoherent -- an approach that has a long history in scholarship on Aristotle (nicely documented in Destrée's essay [140n2]), and is adopted by Marco Zingano, who in "Akrasia and the Methods of Ethics" attributes the inconsistency to Aristotle's employment of the method of endoxa.

Both Pierre Destrée in "Aristotle on the Causes of Akrasia" and David Charles in "Aristotle's Weak Akrates: What does her Ignorance Consist in?" aim to defend Aristotle against the charge of inconsistency -- Destrée by offering a formidable textual argument about how to understand the two syllogisms that Aristotle attributes to the akratic agent in EN VII 3, and Charles by appealing to the De Anima to argue, quite persuasively, that Aristotle's conception of practical cognition essentially involves desire, and thus that recent debates between "Humean" and "cognitivist" interpretations of Aristotle are misconceived.

We have no evidence that later Ancient philosophers shared Aristotle's and Plato's worry that the phenomena of self-mastery and its failure pose important puzzles that must be addressed by ethical philosophy.  Ricardo Salles' paper, "Epictetus on Moral Responsibility for Precipitate Action", shows that although the Roman Stoic Epictetus was interested in propeteia (acting without due deliberation), which is one of the two kinds of akrasia distinguished by Aristotle (EN VII 7, 1150b19-22), this is not the kind that Aristotle and Socrates find worrisome (although Gerson's brief discussion of propeteia on p. 271 might indicate a stronger connection).  In any case, Salles argues, propeteia interests the Stoics because of its implications for responsibility rather than for moral psychology.

In response to recent proposals that the older Stoics identified akrasia as the root of all the passions, Jean-Baptiste Gourinat's masterful contribution to the volume, "Akrasia and Enkrateia in Ancient Stoicism: Minor Vice and Minor Virtue?", establishes that what the older Stoics call akrasia concerns only those passions within the scope of the virtue of temperance.  Unlike Aristotle however, who distinguished between akrasia and intemperance (akolosia) and between enkrateia and temperance (sôphrosunê), the older Stoics took akrasia to be a species of intemperance and enkrateia to be a species of temperance.  Gourinat's judicious and scholarly assessment of the philological and philosophical issues bearing on the interpretation of this body of doctrine, as well as his extensive documentation of the state of the art in contemporary scholarship, will be enormously valuable to any student of the Stoic doctrine of the virtues.

The final paper in the volume, "Plotinus on Akrasia: the Neoplatonic Synthesis", ranges over Plato, Aristotle, and Stoicism in service of what Lloyd Gerson presents as Plotinus's synthesis of their positions on akrasia.  Gerson gives superb thumbnail sketches of the seminal texts in the Protagoras and Nicomachean Ethics VII 3, as well as of the Platonic principle that no one does wrong willingly, and argues that Plato, Aristotle, and the Stoics agree that akrasia amounts to a failure to identify with one's second order desires.  Crucial to this understanding of akrasia, he argues, is a distinction, not between monistic and pluralistic psychology, but between the true self and the embodied person -- a distinction central to Plotinus' philosophy.  Gerson elucidates this distinction by exploring Plotinus' account of voluntary and involuntary desires.

The essays in the volume are methodologically diverse -- some focusing on the detailed interpretation of the ancient texts themselves (Gourinat, Destrée, Garone), others on the structure of the disagreement among modern interpreters (Charles, Brickhouse and Smith), some considering the ancient texts in the intellectual context of their contemporaries (Dorion), others bringing modern philosophical questions to bear on the interpretation of the ancients (Bobonich).  Most are self-contained, but some are parts of or depend on larger projects, outside of whose context they are not easy to appreciate (Weiss, Rowe, and to a certain extent Gerson).

The collection is not intended to present a consistent and integrated position.  Thus, even though there is a distracting inconsistency across the essays in the use of crucial terminology such as 'akrasia', with some contributors using it (as Aristotle does) to refer to the phenomenon of implementation failure, while others use it to refer to the narrower (on Socrates' view, non-existent) phenomenon of having one's practical knowledge overcome by pleasure, this range of usage is a lamentable feature of the current state of the art -- one that hopefully Shields' clarifying questions about akrasia (pp. 63-7) will help to eradicate.  On the whole, the most effective contributions challenge the "standard interpretation" of Plato, and its distorting effect on the interpretation of Aristotle (Brickhouse and Smith, Destrée, Charles), or expand the range of evidence considered beyond the canonical texts in Plato and Aristotle to their broader intellectual context (Dorion, Garone) or later development (Gourinat).

Most of the essays in the volume are based on papers delivered at a conference on akrasia at l'Université Catholique de Louvain in December 2003, or were commissioned for the volume.  Only one paper (Weiss's) has previously appeared in print.  All of the papers are in English, some of them translated into English (with one exception, quite idiomatically).  Quotations from ancient authors are given in English translation, with Greek and Latin originals easily accessible in footnotes.  Although there is no general index, scholars will be well served by the index locorum, the index of modern authors, and the substantial and up to date bibliography (although I note that the latter lists two works by William Fortenbaugh under the authorship of Maximilian Forschner).  The volume is well and handsomely produced with adequate margins and (that vanishing luxury) footnotes at the bottom of the page; however, there are an unusually large number of proofreading and copy editing errors.  Nonetheless, the volume's contents provide a valuable overview of and guide to the complexity of the issues and the variety of contemporary and historical approaches to them, in addition to advancing the discussion on several fronts.  While its hefty price is likely beyond the budget of most individual scholars, any library seeking to keep up with the state of the art in Ancient philosophy should definitely acquire it.

[1] The popularity of this interpretation in recent decades stems from its influential articulation by Terence Irwin in Plato's Moral Theory (Oxford, 1977), although more recently, in Plato's Ethics (Oxford 1995), Irwin demurs from concluding that, on the tripartite psychology of the Republic, one can know the wrongness of a course of action one finds pleasant or otherwise attractive (237).